Anti-Individualism and Knowledge

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Brown, Jessica, Anti-Individualism and Knowledge, MIT Press, 2004, xiv + 339 pp, $25 (pbk), ISBN 0-262-02558-2.

Reviewed by Sarah Sawyer, University of Nebraska, Lincoln


Brown's book is a defense of anti-individualism in so far as it succeeds in undermining a series of arguments each of which supposedly tells against it. The book comprises three parts: the first concerns the achievement problem; the second concerns anti-individualism and rationality; and the third concerns the consequence problem. It is a welcome addition to the literature in part because it comes in book form and hence gathers many of the recent concerns surrounding the plausibility of anti-individualism together. Moreover, the book marks a change in Brown's own views from a suspicion of anti-individualism to a defense thereof, and for many this will be viewed not only as a move in the right direction on Brown's part but as a small victory for anti-individualism more generally.

One of the positive aspects of the book is its attempt to provide a taxonomy of the various kinds of anti-individualism in the first, introductory chapter. We are reminded of the familiar three-fold distinction between social, natural-kind, and singular anti-individualism; of the less discussed distinction within the latter two between the descriptive version of anti-individualism and the illusion version of anti-individualism--classified according to whether attempts to think thoughts in so-called 'empty cases' leaves one with an individualistic descriptive thought or merely with the illusion of a thought; and finally of the distinction between Fregean anti-individualism which countenances Fregean senses, and non-Fregean anti-individualism which does not. While the attempt to provide such a taxonomy is admirable, there is a curious equation of Fregean anti-individualism with the doctrine of object-dependent senses as defended, for instance, by Gareth Evans (The Varieties of Reference. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1982) and John McDowell ('On the Sense and Reference of a Proper Name.' Mind 86: 159-185, 1977). As a result the discussion of Fregean versus non-Fregean anti-individualism is largely confined to a discussion concerning what is expressed by a singular term. Moreover, even within this realm Brown appears to equate Fregean anti-individualism with the doctrine of object-dependent senses because she sees the only alternative as one according to which singular terms express descriptive senses, and in turn sees descriptive senses as essentially individualistic. I do not see why either of these claims should be true: it is unclear why, if a singular term expresses a sense, it must be either descriptive or object-dependent, and equally unclear why descriptions need be individualistic. One factor that may be playing a role here is the lack of a distinction between cognitive value and linguistic meaning. The omission is itself unfortunate given the central role of the distinction in the work of Tyler Burge and the central role of Burge in the promotion and defense of anti-individualism. Nevertheless, a discussion of both the distinction between the descriptive version and the illusion version of anti-individualism­, and of the notion of object-dependent sense is welcome.

Chapters two, three, and four are together devoted to an extensive discussion of the discrimination argument and the illusion argument, each of which is a version of what Martin Davies has called Ôthe achievement problem' ('Externalism, Architecturalism, and Epistemic Warrant.' In Wright, C., Smith, B. C., and MacDonald, C., eds, Knowing our Own Minds. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1998: 321-361). According to the discrimination argument, anti-individualism threatens privileged access by undermining a subject's ability to distinguish a priori between the thought contents she actually has and the thought contents she would have in various counterfactual situations (pp. 37-8). Brown sees the standard anti-individualist response as accepting that the counterfactual situations to which the argument appeals are relevant and hence potentially knowledge-undermining, but pointing out that the subject is nonetheless reliable in forming second-order beliefs. However, Brown does not think this constitutes an adequate response since reliability at the second-order intentional level is consistent with the absence of a discriminative ability, and it is precisely the alleged absence of a discriminative ability that was thought to be problematic (p. 39). Prima facie what would be needed, Brown claims, is either a supplementary argument to the effect that knowledge does not in fact require discriminative abilities but only reliability, or a reason to think that anti-individualism does not after all undermine a subject's discriminative abilities. According to Brown, neither has thus far been given. Moreover, the first strategy looks dubious given that the epistemological literature typically taken to support reliabilist accounts of knowledge provides equal support for the disputed claim that knowledge requires a discriminative ability; and the second strategy looks dubious given the implausibility of building a discrimination requirement into an account of thought (chapter 3).

Brown's own solution is, rather, to reject the claim that the counterfactual situations appealed to in the discrimination argument are normally relevant. The apparent benefit here is that if the counterfactual situations are not normally relevant, they will not undermine one's introspective knowledge regardless of whether knowledge requires mere reliability or the more elusive discriminative abilities. The illusion argument, directed specifically at the illusion version of anti-individualism, is answered in a similar vein: the possibility that one is suffering an illusion of thought would undermine one's ability introspectively to know what one is thinking only if such a possibility were relevant, but, Brown argues, such a possibility is not normally relevant. The novelty in this section does not lie so much in Brown's denial that the alternatives are normally relevant as in her detailed discussion of parts of the epistemological literatureÑparticularly of the notions of reliability and of discriminative abilities--and in her discussion of the criteria for relevance with respect to socially individuated thoughts, natural-kind thoughts, and singular thoughts respectively (pp. 138-156). (For previous defenses of the claim that the alternatives are not normally relevant see for example Sawyer, S. 'An Externalist Account of Introspective Knowledge.' Pacific Philosophical Quarterly 80: 358-78, 1999; and Warfield, T. 'Privileged Self-Knowledge and Externalism are Compatible.' Analysis 52: 232-237, 1992, and 'Externalism, Privileged Self-Knowledge, and the Irrelevance of Slow Switching.' Analysis 57: 282-284, 1997.)

Chapters five and six concern the implications of anti-individualism for rationality. Brown argues that Fregean anti-individualism is incompatible with transparency of difference of thought content (which, she claims, undercuts the very motivation for Fregean sense), and that non-Fregean anti-individualism is incompatible with transparency both of difference and of sameness of thought content. These in turn have consequences for a subject's ability to draw valid inferences, to avoid drawing invalid inferences, and to recognize simple inconsistencies in thought. After a lengthy discussion of the effect of 'switching' on a subject's set of concepts, Brown, following John Campbell ('Is Sense Transparent?' Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society 61: 273-292, 1987), distinguishes the ability to grasp a priori that thoughts specified as having a certain form have certain logical properties, from the ability to grasp a priori of what form one's thoughts are (p. 184). The first, according to Brown, is all that is required of a rational agent; indeed, she claims, there are reasons independent of anti-individualism to suppose that we are generally not rational in the second sense, and hence anti-individualism in particular cannot be faulted for having this consequence. (cf. Wason, P., and Johnson-Laird, P. The Psychology of Reasoning. Cambridge, Mass.: Harvard University Press, 1972.; and Owens, J. 'Contradictory Belief and Cognitive Access.' in French, P., Uehling, T., and Wettstein, H., eds Midwest Studies: Contemporary Perspectives in the Philosophy of Language II 14. Notre Dame: University of Notre Dame Press, 1989.) While this section of the book contains a brief and partial respite from the equation of Fregean anti-individualism with the doctrine of object-dependent sense, the focus on singular terms conceived as expressing object-dependent senses still plays a large enough role in the arguments of chapter six in particular that the scope of the arguments is less than fully clear.

Chapters seven and eight concern the consequence problem, a problem Brown once took to tell against anti-individualism ('The Incompatibility of Anti-Individualism and Privileged Access.' Analysis 53: 149-156, 1995). If anti-individualism is true and introspective knowledge is possible, so the argument goes, a subject could gain knowledge of substantive facts about the world merely by reflection on her thoughts and on the mind-world entailments the thesis of anti-individualism supposedly delivers by armchair reflection; but surely such armchair reflection should not yield such prima facie empirical knowledge (p. 236). Brown's first concern is to dismiss various responses to the problem, and here she focuses most notably on the Wright-Davies response (Wright, 'Cogency and Question-Begging: Some Reflections on McKinsey's Paradox, and Putnam's Proof.' Philosophical Topics 10:140-163, 2000; Davies 1998 op. cit.). In different ways, Wright and Davies have argued that the a priori warrant attaching to one's second-order beliefs does not transmit across a supposed a priori known entailment from mind to world to yield a warranted a priori belief about the nature of one's world. Wright's particular proposal is rejected in part on the grounds that it invites skepticism about the availability of warrant for ordinary claims, and in part on the grounds that it commits one to the claim that the problematic beliefs are indeed a priori warranted, thereby failing to solve the initial problem. Davies's proposal is rejected on the grounds that it relies on a relevant alternatives account not of knowledge, which would be acceptable, but of warrant, which turns out to be unacceptable. While criticisms of Wright are by now familiar, the criticisms of Davies are not. In addition, there is much to be valued in the comprehensive treatment of and comparison between the two strategies, which are typically treated together. Brown's preferred strategy is to argue that knowledge of the arguments for anti-individualism does not enable a subject who thinks that p, where the thought that p is individuated by some environmental condition E, to know a priori that if she thinks that p then E. Rather, a subject could only know a priori that if she thinks that p and certain other conditions obtain (such as that she is not suffering an illusion of content), then E; but a subject cannot know a priori that these other conditions obtain, and hence cannot know a priori that E. (cf. Gallois, A. and O'Leary-Hawthorne, J. 'Externalism and Scepticism.' Philosophical Studies 81: 1-26, 1996; and McLaughlin, B. and Tye, M. 'Content Externalism and Privileged Access.' Philosophical Review 107: 349-380, 1998.) At various points throughout this discussion it is clear that Brown equates a priori warrant with warrant sufficient to refute skepticism about both the existence and the nature of the external world. Brown is not to be singled out in this regard, since the equation is prevalent in the literature. However, it is unfortunate, given that it blurs two distinct questions: first, the question of whether a priori warrant for such beliefs is available; and second, the question of whether, if a priori warrant for such beliefs is available, it could be put to anti-skeptical use. The questions can be seen to be distinct by seeing that a priori warrants are defeasible and hence, perhaps, no more likely to withstand skeptical doubts than empirical warrants. Recognition of this distinction would likely be beneficial to the literature in general.

The book is not entirely novel in its approach to the various problems, but it is clearly structured and characteristically detailed in the topics it addresses. In addition it will be heartening for anti-individualists to see another convert.