Antithetical Arts: On the Ancient Quarrel between Literature and Music

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Peter Kivy, Antithetical Arts: On the Ancient Quarrel between Literature and Music, Oxford UP, 2009, 240pp., $55.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199562800.

Reviewed by Peter Rinderle, University of Tübingen



The title and subtitle of Peter Kivy’s new book might be considered as slightly misleading, as it is the meaning of pure or absolute music and its value which are really its main concern. Kivy is not at all interested in the respective merits of two different art forms, and he doesn’t deny the possibility of successfully combining meaningful words and beautiful noises in songs or operas. So there is no general antithesis between literature and music. His central question is what to make of the strange phenomenon that developed in the late 18th and early 19th century and which we call ‘absolute music’. How are we to understand those beautiful noises made by a symphony orchestra, a string quartet or a piano player? And why do we value them so highly?

It is the quarrel between two opposing traditions about how to understand music to which the title alludes. The narrativists, as Kivy calls them, use a literary analogy. They attribute meaning to a piece of instrumental music as they attribute meaning to a novel or a theatre play. For them, in music as in novels we are mainly interested in the representation and arousal of certain emotions. The formalists, on the other hand — and Kivy is the leading musical formalist of our times — are strongly opposed to this way of “reading” absolute music. It is the formal composition in which the meaning of music resides and it is an ecstatic or even mystical experience to which music, if attended to appropriately, might lead that is the true source of its value.

As far as its own formal composition is concerned, the book might first appear as a collection of eleven separate essays, three of which have been published already. But Kivy, by amply providing little summaries of his claims and transitions between the individual chapters, manages to create a well-organized whole. The book has three parts: Part I provides an account of the historical origins of the quarrel between the narrativists and the formalists. Part II is primarily concerned with a critique of the leading narrativists in musicology and music philosophy in the present debate. In Part III, Kivy tries to present a more positive account of the value of absolute music.

In the first part, Kivy shows that the quarrel between literature and music has historical roots that reach back at least to the 18th century. Back then, the question was how to understand the relation between words and music, particularly in operas. Most people thought that music ought to be the servant to the text and that the meaning of a piece of music is always finally pre-established by the words to which it is put. But others, among them Mozart, accorded music the primacy, and there was an accepted, although not widespread, practice of putting words to previously composed music. Here we have a philosophical puzzle: if music is accorded the primacy or a complete independence from words, how do we know which words will fit its meaning? Hanslick, the radical formalist, argues that music doesn’t have any extra-musical content in the first place. Words and music are two completely different sorts of beasts.

Although Kivy certainly wants to accord a primacy to music, Hanslick’s position seems highly implausible to him. Even if, as a formalist, he denies that music has any representational or semantic content, Kivy doesn’t deny, as Hanslick does, the expressive properties of music. A melody doesn’t represent any particular emotion and is not able to arouse emotions in an aesthetically relevant way, but it might still appear as sad or joyful. These emotive appearances, however, do not give any content to absolute music — they just enrich its formal structure. Kivy speaks of an ‘enhanced’ version of formalism, and it might thus be perfectly reasonable to ask whether the words fit a certain melody. Kivy observes that Hanslick, in the foreword to the eighth edition of Of Musical Beauty, already had a glimpse of the truth in this matter and missed a great opportunity. Hanslick there remarks that we speak of the fragrance of a rose — as a perceptual property — taking this quality to be a representation of fragrance.

His extension of formalism notwithstanding, Kivy still finds himself in sharp disagreement with the narrativist. The latter assumes that the music itself contains all the material of a story we possibly could need and that music can be understood like a novel. So in Part II of his book Kivy turns to the present scene and gives a detailed account of several recent attempts to interpret Brahms’ Intermezzo in B-flat Minor, Op. 117, No. 2 (by Jenefer Robinson), Beethoven’s String Quartet in F-Minor, No. 95 (by Fred Maus), the second movement of Mahler’s 9th Symphony (by Anthony Newcomb) and Shostakovich’s 10th Symphony (by Gregory Karl and Jenefer Robinson).

First of all, he distinguishes two distinct groups among those using the literary analogy to interpret absolute music. Some authors — they are in the smaller group — tend to describe absolute music in all kinds of details including proper names. Kivy dismisses this first approach right away, without paying sufficient attention to the fact that the difference between those approaches might just be a gradual difference rather than a categorical or qualitative one. Then he focuses on those authors who proceed much more cautiously and merely speak of an indefinite persona that the attentive and cultivated listener might discover in a piece of instrumental music. Today, this approach is usually called the persona theory of musical expressiveness and is defended by philosophers such as Aaron Ridley, Jerrold Levinson and Jenefer Robinson.

The main aim of the persona theory is to give an account of the expressive properties of absolute music. The claim is that while listening to a piece of music, the listener imagines an indefinite person who expresses his or her emotions in the music. A piece of music thus might appear to be sad because the musical persona is imagined to be sad. While imagining a hypothetical persona to be sad the listener also responds emotionally to the music: he either identifies with the persona and feels sad himself, or he sympathizes with the person and feels pity for her. In this manner, the persona theorist isn’t merely able to tell us what a piece of music means; he also can give an account of why a piece of music can be of so much interest and value to its listener.

Most of the doubts Kivy raises about the literary analogy are, by now, quite well known as they have been discussed extensively in the literature: Why should we be interested in all the repetitions we find in absolute music and we don’t find in literature? Can pure instrumental music really give a description detailed enough to attribute a specific emotion to a musical persona? How could absolute music tell us something about the gender of this person or the object of his or her emotions? Kivy thinks these details, if at all, are to be found in the mind of the listener alone. He accuses the listener of using his private and completely idiosyncratic associations and then of projecting certain characteristics on the music. Obviously all this, Kivy argues, has nothing to do whatsoever with really understanding and appreciating a piece of absolute music.

To a certain extent, I understand Kivy’s worries very well. He is surely right to point to the danger of using music merely as a screen for projecting one’s personal fantasies. But someone interested in the music for its own sake might very well be able to distinguish between this kind of, as one might say, perverted use of music and a way of properly paying attention to the meaning of a piece of music that also respects its aesthetic autonomy. Besides, the advantage of the persona theory is just simply that it has found an explanation of the expressive properties of music and its particular interest to its listener.

Kivy, however, has a new objection to offer with which he tries to show the absurdity of a narrativist position. If, and this is the first premise of his argument, the narrativists had got it right, there wouldn’t be any absolute music at all. The class of pure music — which is precisely defined as having no extra-musical content — would be empty. But, here we have the second premise, certainly nobody would want to deny the existence of pure music. Therefore, Kivy concludes, the narrativist must be wrong. He readily concedes that there is some instrumental music we only have thought to be absolute music. But in the process of understanding it, it might turn out, that this piece actually has an extra-musical content and therefore is a piece of program music. But that cannot be true for all pieces of instrumental music. There wouldn’t be any absolute music left.

I do not think this argument is convincing because the definition of absolute music and its distinction from program music is not as clear-cut as Kivy thinks. True enough, we want to distinguish absolute music, which does not refer to an independently given story or person, from program music, which aims directly at the description of a particular story or a particular person that exists independently and outside of music. This in itself, however, is no reason to deny the possibility that absolute music reveals to us particular emotions of an imaginary human being who, precisely, does not exist outside of the piece in question. Willing to admit some extra-musical content, a narrativist still would not want to speak of program music in such a case. Kivy isn’t blind; he sees the danger he runs into and he surely tries to get around the obvious objection that the dispute between the two traditions cannot be settled by a definitional stipulation. Nevertheless in the end, instead of avoiding this danger, he falls prey to it.

What does Kivy have to offer in order to answer the question of our particular interest in absolute music? Remember, absolute music doesn’t have a text, so it doesn’t have a literary meaning. Although it therefore can’t teach us any moral lessons, Kivy concedes that it might turn us, for the moment of listening at least, into a better person and improve our character. So music might be attributed a moral force, however limited, after all. It seems to me, however, that Kivy doesn’t see that this move cannot be considered as a concession at all. What kind of “character” is this which alters as soon as one turns on the CD player? Wouldn’t we want to say that “character” refers to a more or less stable motivation to act? The relatively short time we listen to music is surely too brief to change our character. Of course, we might think better of ourselves and of our characters during listening to the Eroica, but that cannot be considered either a sufficient or even a necessary condition for really being a better person.

In any case, Kivy has to answer the question of why we consider music valuable if its effects are only transitory. His last chapter, “Empty Pleasure to the Ear”, defends the uselessness of the pleasure that music may give its attentive listener. If pleasure is a good in itself, and that can hardly be denied, and if listening to music provides us with pleasure, this is all we need to appreciate absolute music. Further, music surely is not a pleasure to the ears alone; it might be the source of very valuable intellectual pleasures as well. Kivy grants that music is a kind of empty pleasure that does not have any particular use and value beyond itself. But even empty pleasures are very good things to have in life! According to Kivy, how music succeeds in giving us this kind of pleasure, how music might provide us states of ecstasy must, in the end, remain a mystery.

His intellectual honesty notwithstanding, this seems to me a somewhat disappointing conclusion. Surely, music might be pleasant, but it might in some cases also be highly unpleasant, and we still wouldn’t want to miss it. In this respect, music is quite on a par with tragedy, for example. Instead of simply talking of mystery, the persona theory has much less exciting but much more plausible explanations to offer for our interest in music. Music might serve to articulate, to reflect and thus to cultivate certain emotions. This is a process that might, at times, be quite painful too. But isn’t that also a value in itself which in no way undermines the high esteem in which we hold music? Kivy, not being an ethical hedonist, should also recognize the value of unpleasant or even painful emotions. In comparison to the persona theory, Kivy’s formalism still leaves a lot to be desired in the explanation of the particular value of music.

At the end of the day, the major issue that is really at stake between the formalist and the narrativist seems to be a fundamentally different approach towards our human existence. Kivy sides with Schopenhauer at least on this issue: our everyday lives are either painful or boring, and only music, by providing us with ecstatic, mystical experiences, is able to make us forget, at least for a short while, the dull, miserable and lonely existence here on earth. The narrativist takes a much more pedestrian approach: music enables us to put some distance between us and our everyday emotions, not to escape them and leave them behind. It allows us to try out, in imagination, a variety of affective states and to make acquaintance with many new and potentially interesting imaginary people. From this perspective, listening to music can even be understood and appreciated as a kind of socializing. Both of these attitudes surely are respectable, but the aim of the former approach — the wish to finally transcend ourselves — just simply depends on a much more controversial conception of human life than the aim of the latter — the ambition to clarify, extend and educate ourselves.

Kivy’s book is written in an extraordinarily clear and lucid style. There is a little surprise, an unexpected or witty observation, a new turn of the argument waiting at every other turn of the page. Furthermore, one might even say that Kivy’s prose has a distinctive musical flavor to it. So it would be a mistake to speak of a quarrel between the philosophical content and the highly “musical” composition of the book. It also has many instructive historical details on the long debate about how to understand music. In the limited space of this review I couldn’t even mention, let alone do justice, for example, to his highly interesting discussion of Kant’s musical formalism. Kivy is honest enough to admit problems and deficits in his defense of an enhanced formalism. Although it is difficult to imagine a narrativist being much impressed by Kivy’s arguments, all of them should read this wonderful book. Like music, it can be a source of great pleasure and insight to the reader.