Anywhere Or Not At All: Philosophy of Contemporary Art

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Peter Osborne, Anywhere Or Not At All: Philosophy of Contemporary Art, Verso, 2013, 282pp., $29.95 (pbk), ISBN 9781781680940.

Reviewed by John Rapko, College of Marin


In his new book Peter Osborne attempts to give a philosophical account of contemporary visual art. Osborne claims that contemporary art is in what he calls a post-conceptual condition arising from three recent events in the visual arts: the broad acceptance of the idea that any materials, and not just traditional ones used in drawing, painting, and sculpture, can be put to use in a work of art; the broad acceptance of conceptualism, understood as a theory of art claiming that a work of art is the contingent embodiment of an 'idea' or 'concept'; and the broad acceptance of the idea that contemporary works of art embody the working out of these two points, resulting in their 'transcategorial' condition, wherein paradigmatic works consist of elements from different mediums or spheres, unified by some governing idea. Such works present novel challenges to understanding, but Osborne is particularly concerned that the practice of art in contemporary life tends to succumb to a kind of social pressure to conformism, which manifests itself most saliently in the attempt to understand works of contemporary art as instances of the traditional genres of painting and sculpture, suitably expanded. Against this conformism, Osborne urges a 'critical' philosophy of contemporary art, one that in addition is closer to the achievements the works embody than is grasped in the conformist model.

A direct consequence of this approach is that Osborne is not interested in surveying the range of contemporary visual art -- works in new media, collage, installation, performances, as well as works with the traditional genres of painting and sculpture. Instead he identifies himself with the post-Kantian European tradition whose outstanding recent representative is Theodor Adorno, a tradition that focuses on a very small number of paradigmatic works, namely those that can be plausibly viewed as embodying or responsive to the most stringent demands placed upon the arts: The demands placed upon such works flow from their 'contemporaneity', that is, from their ascribed aim to embody various important aspects of distinctively contemporary life. So a second major aspect of the philosophy of contemporary art is to investigate whether and in what sense contemporary art is distinct from modern and non- or pre-modern arts.

But the determination of the general features in abstraction from their embodiment in particulars remains indefinite and opaque. The investigation of these two aspects cannot be ultimately separated from each other, because for Osborne what makes a work paradigmatic is that it reflects or embodies those very features that mark contemporary art most distinctively. The philosophical inquiry into contemporary art is thereby marked by a circularity bound to the dialectical quality of the investigation -- the unfolding grasp of the distinctiveness of contemporary art helps bring into view and make salient which particular works most fully embody contemporaneity, while simultaneously the distinctiveness of contemporary art generally only emerges and is made determinate through consideration of particular works.

On Osborne's account the pivotal moment in art history for the emergence of distinctively contemporary art is the short-lived Conceptual Art movement in the United States and England, particularly in the work of Sol LeWitt and Joseph Kosuth in the late 1960s. The central concern is to advance the conception that what is of central importance in a work of art is the idea governing, organizing, and/or unifying the work. This thought is made more determinate with the claim that the idea need not be embodied or 'realized' in any particular medium, and similarly, any particular embodiment, or series of embodiments, do not exhaust the artistic interest of the idea. In this sense, the artistic interest of the idea always 'exceeds' its embodiments. The embodiments afford perception for a work's viewers, and such perceptions and their expressive qualities constitute the aesthetic dimension of the artwork. But since by stipulation the (non-perceptible) 'idea' of the work is what is of artistic interest, conceptual art is a non-aesthetic art.1 Further, the emergence and development of conceptual art is driven by the conceptual artist's desire to eliminate the aesthetic dimension of the artwork, and so conceptual art is anti-aesthetic. But conceptual art was a short-lived movement: the desire to present works without aesthetics drives artists to present bits of text, the burden of which is simply to argue for their own status as artworks.

Yet the movement, Osborne thinks, has established a new ontology for artworks. The achievement of conceptual art is to break in practice the hitherto taken-for-granted equation between the realm of aesthetics and that of artworks. Though conceptual art ended in a kind of self-trivialisation wherein the subject of work is simply the assertion that the work is indeed an artwork, contemporary artworks maintain as part of their ontology the condition that a non-aesthetic idea is part of a (serious and non-conformist) work. Aesthetics returns, but no longer as exhaustive of the center of artistic interest. As Osborne puts it, conceptuality is a necessary but insufficient condition for something being a work of contemporary art. The sufficient conditions are supplied by the use of various materials, put to artistic uses within the characteristic conditions of contemporary art.

Much of the effort, both analytical and polemical, of the book is devoted to presenting the distinction between conformist and critical ways of construing the physical materials of contemporary works. As noted above, Osborne is particularly opposed to thinking of post-conceptual artworks as expanded versions or developments of the traditional genres of painting and sculpture, and offers as an alternative various considerations for thinking that seeking continuity between contemporary and pre-contemporary art in this way is misguided. One problem is that such a construal could not contribute to a philosophical account of the basic features of contemporary art, which is marked by non-traditional uses of traditional materials, non-traditional materials, and emergent genres such as installation, video, and performance.

A ready response to this would be that construing post-conceptual art as falling into expanded traditional genres along with new genres provides a stable framework for categorization, and further helps shape an investigation into the ways in which perennial ways of making artistic meaning are taken up in both kinds of newer arts. For Osborne this response is superficial, as it misses the key phenomenon of the "the crisis of mediations." (p. 83) This crisis arises as an expression of a long-term process of social transformation increasingly embodying and institutionalizing the conception of freedom as the unhindered expression of individuals, with the concurrent conception of art as an expression of freedom. "Yet, in art as in life, absolute individuation destroys meaning." (p. 107) So for works of art to be so much as intelligible, or "to acquire social objectivity" (p. 107), there must be categories, or 'mediations'. The categories of contemporary art are then "mediations of the crisis of mediation." (p. 83)

In Osborne's usage "mediation" is the most general term for whatever categories are used in classifying and understanding the arts; 'period', 'style', 'genre', and 'medium' are all artistic mediations. At least for modern and contemporary art, which mediations are rightly used (that is, the ones that play a productive critical, non- or anti-conformist role) is itself a major issue in understanding the art. 'Period' is the most general of the mediations, as in 'modern art' or 'contemporary art', and the determination of the central mediation within a period is both contested and holistic; the former, in that there are relatively conformist and relatively critical ways of conceptualizing a period; the latter, in that the particular conceptualization of the period orients the mutual determination of the less general mediations. In addition to these mediations mentioned above, Osborne takes each period to embody a distinctive conception of artistic unity, that is, of what counts as integral to a (good) artwork. Osborne points to the centrality in recent art of works presented on the model of unity as a series, and not of works presented so to speak one at a time. Osborne explicates this as a kind of resumption of the philosophical Romanticism of Friedrich Schlegel and Novalis: the work is a fragment of an infinite project that attempts to embody the artist's full sense of self and self-awareness. As such, the project is infinite, and the series can only be grasped as an infinite approximation.

Contemporary art, then, considered as a non-conformist, critical activity, is a post-conceptual art of series and ephemeral categorizations ('mediations'). Osborne attempts to make this account more determinate in three ways. First, he repeatedly criticizes what he takes to be the leading alternative account, one he associates with a concern for 'medium-specificity', which was influentially articulated by Clement Greenberg, and whose prominent representatives currently are the art historian Michael Fried and the photographer Jeff Wall. Second, he offers an account of the artist Robert Smithson's work and his influential conception of artworks as structured by a 'dialectic of site and non-site'. Third, he offers an account of several recent exemplary works, each using multi-media to address the topic of displacement of peoples and memory.

(1) "Medium-specific" modernism is one of three salient ways in which the temporal dynamism characteristic of modernism is conceived and practiced. The dynamic common to these ways is the concern embodied by modernist art to reject the past, established art forms and their typical ways of being practiced in favor of some new manner, and thereby to affirm the new manner as a way, and perhaps the uniquely appropriate way, of practicing a kind of art expressive of the modern world. Osborne claims that this conceptualization "ontologizes the plurality of arts as mediums" (p. 80); that is, each medium (again: painting and sculpture) "expresses an 'irreducible element' of experience" (p. 80), and so its practice presumably is legitimated to the extent that works in a particular medium express the relevant element. A problem with this conception is that it blocks the formation of the "generic conception" of a work of contemporary art that best captures the work's distinctive ontology. In this 'generic' conception of art, artworks are categorized primarily as (simply) art, and not primarily as instances of a particular medium, such as painting; there are of course artistic paintings in contemporary art, but on this conception only as and through 'determinate negations' of their traditional or modernist character.

A second problem, flowing from the first, is that medium-specific modernism blocks "the very possibility of attributing significant critical meaning to the concept of art in general." (p. 80) Osborne's thought seems to be that (a) for a (kind of) artwork to be critical, it must have and use the means to be reflective of the social conditions wherein it is typically made and exhibited, and (b) the practice of an artistic medium embodies a historical continuity, and to the extent it does, the practice cannot be construed as a reflection on the particular current social conditions of its possibility. Jeff Wall's attempt to orient his photography to the depictive tradition previously carried by painting must lapse into the conformism of the practice of traditional media. So treating artistic mediums in contemporary art as the basic categories of art misses both the distinctiveness of contemporary art and its critical vocation of reflection upon its conditions.

(2) Like a number of other authors, Osborne thinks that the work and writings of Robert Smithson are one of the fundamental achievements and points of orientation in contemporary art. Osborne argues that Smithson's achievement suffers the same sort of conformist construal that leads the 'mediations' in contemporary art to be interpreted as loosened-up versions of traditional categories. Smithson's proposal for the practical conception of an artwork was to treat it as a relation of 'site' and 'non-site'. (p. 109) This meant, first of all, that the creative process centrally concerned taking some materials from one place (the 'site') and exhibiting them in a second place (the 'non-site'). Suitably worked and exhibited, the materials of the non-site would stand in semantic relations of 'reflection' and 'representation' to the site.

Further, the worked and exhibited materials and their contextual non-site could be treated to further semantic operations, such as being drawn, photographed, or filmed; the initial non-site could then in turn be the site of these further materials exhibited yet elsewhere. And the process of taking something from a site to a non-site could itself be documented or represented, producing thereby, and in an in principle open-ended way, further materials for further sites and non-sites. The term 'relation (or dialectic) of site and non-site', then, and with it Smithson's work, is meant to indicate the entire non-finite process.2 Osborne rightly notes that both the recent conceptualization of Smithson as a sculptor, and in the works of recent artists practicing an 'academic formalism' in attempting to orient themselves to Smithson's work, fail to grasp the breadth of Smithson's conception. Properly, that is, 'critically' understood, Smithson's conceptualization is grist for Osborne's mill: the conceptual dimension is ineliminable but insufficient, and all of Smithson's later works involve minimally a site, an initial non-site, and some further documentation.

(3) Finally, Osborne considers (pp. 196-201) three recent works that to varying degrees evade the conformist pressures on contemporary art. Along with the academic formalism pertinently exemplified by works of the artists Tacita Dean and Renée Green, addressing in a conformist manner the legacy of Smithson, there is a much more salient concern in contemporary art, so Osborne alleges, with 'memory' and 'place'. The alleged problem with many contemporary works embodying these concerns is their elimination of the 'non-site' dimension of the critical contemporary conceptualization, in favor of creating or re-creating a site of sited-work charged with the charisma of historical memory. The more critical works that Osborne favors address the concern with memory, but in different ways that share a number of features: they all use video, split screens and/or multiple tracks, and rhythmic sounds "to register a more somatic, pre-symbolic level of memory." (p. 200) As a result these works are not conformist artifacts of cultural memory, but rather ones of "constructed history" that stage "the disparity between memory and historical experience through a subjugation of memories to artistic form." (p. 201)

One point, not yet mentioned, upon which Osborne puts great emphasis concerns not so much contemporary art itself as philosophizing about it. Contemporary art is as yet not a field of artistic activity with clearly defined boundaries, and not only because of its orienting ideology of placing no restrictions upon the sorts of materials that can be used in a work, nor because the line between modern and contemporary art is uncertain. Osborne stresses that the conceptualization of contemporary art necessarily includes some conceptualization of its future, chiefly because contemporary art is both incomplete and of indefinite extension, and the very act of taking it as a topic of reflection involve closure, a kind of projection of it as more clarified, more fully realized, and more adequate to its internal aims than it is in its present state. Osborne likens this to the story told by Benedict Anderson of the way in which heterogeneous groups, bound together by material and economic interactions and communications, 'imagine' themselves as a kind of (fictive) unity, the 'nation'. This is a restricted version of a point urged by Adorno generally, that the analysis of cultural phenomena requires the construction of 'models' of the phenomena, in order that the latent forces that structure the phenomena can be considered. Adorno in turn had drawn upon Max Weber's method of constructing 'ideal types' (such as 'the ascetic Protestant', or the 'bureaucrat') in order to analyze cultural phenomena. Osborne is then adapting for philosophical analysis Adorno's and Weber's claim that explanation of cultural phenomena requires the exercise of the theoretical imagination.3

In taking Adorno as a philosophical orientation, Osborne in several ways inherits familiar problems and obscurities of that thinker. Like Adorno, Osborne, liberally uses terminology from Hegel, without offering explicit characterizations of the terms, and while disavowing the Hegelian commitment to unfolding Absolute Knowledge. Besides 'mediation', Osborne uses in particular the terms "reflection" and "determinate negation" throughout. While refraining from explicit definitions of his key technical terms, Adorno gave them a sense, or perhaps allowed whatever sense they had to emerge in use.4 Osborne seems to think similarly that some sense sufficiently determinate for use in characterizing and understanding the phenomena of contemporary art will emerge in his use of such terms. The issue of the meaning of these quasi-Hegelian terms is particularly acute in that Osborne uses them at key points to make out the distinction between conformist and critical conceptions and practices: the valuable sort of transcategorial art is said to arise from a 'determinate negation' of traditional media; as noted above, a critical contemporary work must embody a 'reflection' upon the typical conditions of its exhibition.

But difficulties of using this terminology in understanding particular cases come readily to mind. For example, many modern artists, such as Manet and Picasso, could well be thought to have rejected a certain facility in drawing or painting -- the subtle use of tonal modeling, or a Raphael-like facility for the graceful use of continuous contours -- and so their mature styles might well be described as expressive of the determinate negation of a prominent model of achievement within a sustained artistic use of a medium. And further, to the extent that one conceives of these artists as exemplars and founders of new models of achievement, the work of their followers also embodies such determinate negations. But what of the work of the minimalist Donald Judd, who claims to make 'specific objects' that are neither paintings nor sculptures? Or of conceptual artists who 'determinately negate' the practices of (visual?) artists in making material artifacts? These latter, more thoroughgoing negations are the sorts of cases Osborne is interested in. But unless some specific aims are continuous across the artistic practice before and after its negation, it's unclear how determinate negation can be distinguished from changing the topic or simply doing something else. On a Hegelian understanding, the result of determinate negation preserves what is negated; but in Osborne's explicit account the negated artistic mediations' role in contemporary art involves nothing more than providing some material vehicle for the artistic idea or concept of an artwork; nothing of the characteristic achievements of the medium is preserved, neither its exemplary works as points of orientation, nor the mechanisms of artistic meaning regularly employed.

A second large concern arises in relation to Osborne's accounts of the three 'critical' works. Again, the analysis of exemplary works plays a key role in an Adorno-type analysis, in that it is primarily through such analyses that the philosopher's proposed mediations gain some determinate sense. What is striking in the analyses offered is the appeal to the rhythmic elements of the works as inviting a dimension of somatic response. Nowhere else in the book are such elements and such a response mentioned. Ought not, then, the proposed framework of mediations be modified to include such phenomena? The problem might be thought to be that such phenomena cut across the divide between conformist and critical art, and accounting for them would accordingly blur the distinction. To explicate those phenomena would in turn require, as suggested above, developing a comprehensive theory of artistic meaning in which the account of critical art would play an important though conceptually subordinate role.

This second concern then leads to a third, then, that touches on the most basic issue for Osborne, namely, the distinction between conformist and critical arts and their conceptualizations. As with Osborne's adoption of other aspects of Adorno's thought, he refrains from giving any definition or characterization of these contrary terms in abstraction from employing them in substantive descriptions and interpretations. In the various discussions, Osborne treats them as exclusive: each characterization carries a distinctive canon of works, critical terminology, criteria of excellence, and interest. But one might alternatively think that the distinction is one between a relatively lax and a relatively strenuous conception of artistic success. In Adorno's and other members of the Frankfurt School's distinction between traditional and Critical theory, the claim was that the latter takes on all the descriptive and explanatory burdens of the former, but carries in addition a distinctive 'interest' in emancipation (whereas traditional theory was governed merely by an interest in controlling nature).5 By analogy, critical art might take up the sense of achievement expressed by conformist art, but with the further interest in critique of its conditions of making and exhibition.

An additional concern arises over which particular aspects of Adorno's thought Osborne takes up; repeated attempts to extract a consistent account from Adorno's works, whether in social philosophy, ethics, or aesthetics, have arguably failed, and one might well rather affirm Adorno's persistent rejection of the aim of producing a comprehensive theory of anything, or of treating one of these realms in isolation from the others. A prominent theme in Adorno's aesthetics is that artworks, by their very existence as artifacts brought to some sense of completion and bearing particularly dense meaning and somatic and symbolic resonances, 'tend towards affirmation'; and because modern life is unworthy of affirmation, artworks can only succeed in their broader aim of embodying reflection on modern life, to the very degree to which they undermine their own tendency towards affirmation.6 So neither artistic failure nor artistic success can be treated in isolation or in an unqualified way. The most 'successful' works after 1950 succeed only in their determined self-undermining, and by maintaining some sense of a transcendent and distancing perspective from which the total administration of modern life can be seen. This indetermination of success and failure plays no role in Osborne's account; critical works are a kind of artistic-cultural success, conformist works a failure.

There is much else in the book, including an extended discussion of photography and of issues in what one might call philosophical historiography, arising from the consideration of the imaginative dimension of discussing contemporary art as if it were something already complete. Despite the difficulties, obscurities, and perhaps screens arising from Osborne's particular use of Adorno, the book seems to me an important achievement. This is the first book in English known to me that brings contemporary art as a whole to philosophical consideration, and thereby broadens the characteristic concern of the philosophy of art away from the puzzles associated with conceptual art. Osborne is the first philosopher known to me to have noticed and brought to rich articulation the problem of evaluating distinctively contemporary art, given the 'crisis of mediations' and the sense of any and all categorizations as non-binding. A great deal might well be done, but Osborne's efforts should provide one of the orienting points for future work.


Flam, Jack (ed.), Robert Smithson: The Collected Writings (1996), University of California Press.

Geuss, Raymond, The Idea of a Critical Theory (1981), Cambridge University Press.

-- Morality, Culture, and History: Essays on German Philosophy (1999), Cambridge University Press.

Honneth, Axel, Pathologies of Reason (2009), Columbia University Press.

Rosen, Michael, Hegel's Dialectic and its Criticism (1985), Cambridge University Press.

Shelley, James, "The Problem of Non-Perceptual Art," British Journal of Aesthetics (2003) 43 (4), pp. 363-378.


1 James Shelley has argued that conceptual works can be aesthetic works, though not in the traditional way in which aesthetic qualities are accessible through perception; see James Shelly, "The Problem of Non-Perceptual Art".

2 Smithson developed the conception of his artwork as a dialectic of site and non-site in the late 1960's, and discussed it in writings and interviews, most succinctly at Flam pp.152-3.

3 On Adorno's methodological conception, and its dependence upon Weber, see Honneth, pp. 58-9.

4 For a searching critical analysis of Adorno's attempt to construct a 'negative dialectics', using Hegelian terminology while rejecting the Hegelian claim to embody Absolute Knowledge in a system, see Rosen pp.153-178.

5 Geuss (1981), p. 55.

6 For a statement and some analysis of Adorno's point, see Geuss (1999), pp. 100-103 and p. 123.