Apoha: Buddhist Nominalism and Human Cognition

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Mark Siderits, Tom Tillemans, Arindam Chakrabarti (eds.), Apoha: Buddhist Nominalism and Human Cognition, Columbia University Press, 2011, 333pp., $29.50 (pbk), ISBN 9780231153614.

Reviewed by Joerg Tuske, Salisbury University


The Introduction to this remarkable book opens with the, in my view, clearest and most concise way of explaining what this volume is about:

This book is about the apoha theory of Buddhist nominalism. The apoha theory is first and foremost an approach to the problem of universals -- the problem of the one over the many. The problem is one of explaining how it is possible, when we see a pot, to think of it as a pot and call it by the name "pot," a name that applies to many other particular pots. What is the one thing, being-a-pot, that this particular shares with many other particulars? Is there really such a thing in the world, over and above the individual pots, or is it just a mental construction of some sort? To hold the first alternative is to be a realist about universals, to hold the second is to be a nominalist. The apoha theory is a distinctive Buddhist approach to being a nominalist. (p. 1)

All the essays in this volume grew out of papers presented by some of the leading scholars of Buddhist Philosophy at a conference on this topic in 2006. In addition, the Introduction, written by Arindam Chakrabarti and Mark Siderits, provides the reader not just with an excellent overview of the general subject matter and its historical context, but it also makes apparent the common threads of the various essays and thus weaves them together to form a sustained book-length study of the apoha theory which anybody with an interest in this field should read. This makes the book so much more than the proceedings of a rather specialized conference.

Buddhist philosophers argue that there is no general entity, such as a universal, which is responsible for the fact that we can apply a term, such as "pot," to more than one particular. They argue this because they believe that only momentary particulars exist. Dividing the world into enduring substantial objects that can be classified according to their differing natures is at best a useful illusion, according to Buddhists. The issue then becomes how to explain the fact that we refer to seemingly enduring entities in our language. Buddhists claim that when we use the term "pot" as a general concept, we refer to every individual that is not a non-pot. This is the "distinctive" feature of the Buddhist apoha theory, as mentioned in the above quote. The advantage of this theory for Buddhists is that it does not require any general essence that all pots have to share. Instead, the term "pot" refers as the result of a double negation. The Buddhist philosopher Dharmakīrti (sixth or seventh century CE) provided the famous example of the property of "reducing fever": while some herbs might be fever reducing, these herbs might not have anything in common other than this property. There might not even be one particular way to reduce fever that all of these herbs share. Dharmakīrti argues that it would be obviously foolish to assert that there is a universal "fever-reducingness" or "antipyreticness" that all these herbs inhere in. Instead, it makes more sense to claim that the term "fever-reducing" applies to them because they are not part of the "exclusion class" of non-fever-reducing things. So the term "fever-reducing" applies to particulars that are excluded from the exclusion class. The same applies to any kind term according to the Buddhists; it refers to the exclusion of its exclusion class.

The two Buddhist philosophers who are usually credited with developing the apoha theory are Diṅnāga (c. 480-c. 540 CE) and Dharmakīrti. In the first essay of this collection, Tom Tillemans draws a distinction between their different formulations of this theory, a distinction which is used by many of the authors in this book. Tillemans uses the terms "top-down" and "bottom-up" versions of the apoha theory. He formulates the top-down version of the theory in the following way:

By "top-down" I mean a position that would somehow maintain that it is because of some specific -- and perhaps even very ingenious -- features of the logical operators of negation in the exclusion that the apoha does pertain to particular things, even though it does not have the ontological baggage of a real universal. In short, on a top-down approach the apoha would behave like a property, a sense, or a meaning, which belongs to the conceptual scheme but nonetheless qualifies and serves to pick out the real particulars in the world; because of some features of double negation, we are spared commitment to real universals in addition to real particulars. (p. 53)

This means that, according to the top-down version, the apoha theory allows Buddhists to provide a theory of meaning for kind terms without postulating the existence of universals.

Here is Tillemans's idea of the bottom-up version of the apoha theory:

On a bottom-up approach, causal chains and error are what serve to bridge the scheme-content gap, rather than the logico-metaphysical features of a special sort of double negation. The way words link to things is thus primarily explained through the existence of a causal chain from things to thoughts and then to the utterances of words. (p. 53)

So, according to the bottom-up version of the apoha theory of exclusion, the particulars are causally responsible for our "perception and finally thought and language" (p. 55). The top-down version explains how we can refer to kind terms, i.e., terms that go beyond the particular. The bottom-up version, on the other hand, provides an account of how general concepts are formed out of the perception of particulars. Tillemans associates the top-down version of the theory with Diṅnāga and the bottom-up version with Dharmakīrti. He points out that the top-down version of the theory has received more attention in the secondary literature than the bottom-up approach.

One objection to the top-down approach that has been brought up by classical Indian philosophers as well as contemporary critics is the issue of circularity. Pascale Hugon, among others, addresses this objection in her contribution to this volume. The charge is that in order to form the first exclusion class of "non-pots" I already have to know what a pot is, which means that I have to have an idea that some particulars are pots. Hence I have to be able to refer to pots before being able to refer to "non-pots," but then the negation of "non-pots" as the referent for pots becomes obsolete. This objection assumes the rule of classical logic that a double negation of a proposition is equivalent to the original proposition. This is why the term "not non-pot" would be equivalent to the term "pot."

One standard reply to this charge of circularity is the argument that there are two types of negation involved in the apoha theory. The first type has been labeled "nominally bound" and applies to nouns, such as "pot" and "non-pot." The second type of negation is called "verbally bound," which means the sentential negation of classical logic. The latter is based on bivalence and the law of the excluded middle, so that any sentence p is true if and only if its negation, not p, is false. This means that not-not p is equivalent to p. In the case of nominally bound negation we can have a term such as "unkind" (non-kind), which is incompatible with the term "kind," but it is not the case that a person is necessarily either kind or unkind. Thus the law of the excluded middle does not hold. It is because of this that Buddhists claim that "not non-p" is not the same as "p" and does not require the existence of universals. So "not non-p" supposedly is able to account for the meaning of "p" without collapsing into "p."

In his contribution to this volume, Bob Hale, a self-described "non-expert" on the apoha theory, makes the point that this difference between nominally bound and sentential negation is the reason why the apoha theory is not successful in providing an account of the meaning of a kind term. As mentioned before, nominally bound negation does not involve the law of the excluded middle. So negating "non-p" will not guarantee that we pick out only those things to which the term "p" applies. This is best illustrated by an example: non-Buddhist philosophers might think that the reason why we can say of certain people that they are kind is that they all partake in the universal "kindness." Buddhist philosophers, on the other hand, will argue that the term "kind" refers to those particulars which are not unkind, and there is no reason to postulate the existence of kindness for this. However, as we all know, someone who is "not unkind" is not necessarily kind. So the class of people who do not fall into the group of unkind particulars will not necessarily pick out only those that are kind. It will also pick out those that are neither kind nor unkind. Hence the exclusion of those people cannot tell us why we apply the term "kind" to some people.

In my view, this objection to the apoha theory, as well as two other objections Hale makes and which I cannot discuss here, are devastating for the top-down version of the apoha theory. Hale's objection, however, draws attention to a feature of the apoha theory which is also discussed in the essays by Ole Pind and Prabal Kumar Sen. This is the relationship between the top-down version of the apoha theory and Diṅnāga's theory of inference. For the famous Indian inference "There is fire on the hill because there is smoke there," Diṅnāga divides the world into two classes: the class of places where smoke is not present and the class of places where smoke is present (excluding the place of the particular inference). Based on this division Diṅnāga develops his three conditions that any good reason for an inference must fulfill. This division echoes the division of exclusion classes in the apoha theory.

I think that some of the most interesting arguments of the book come out of the discussion of the bottom-up version of the apoha theory. In their essays, Sen and Jonardon Ganeri discuss ways in which the bottom-up version of the apoha theory accounts for our concept formation and how, given the anti-realist streak of many Buddhist thinkers, we can make sense of the fact that "language can nevertheless function as the medium of communication, and how it assumes such an important role in our behavior, which is so heavily dependent on language" (pp. 170-171).

Ganeri in particular focuses on the problem of how conceptual content can be formed out of the sensory content which is the result of perceiving particulars. He suggests that apoha helps to bridge the gap that exists between the two. For example, according to Ganeri, the apoha theory helps to explain how it is possible for a sentient being to engage in "feature-placing," i.e., the capacity to locate features and to identify places. The problem with this capacity is that it combines general qualities, such as "being red," with particular locations. Here apoha is supposed to bridge the gap between the level of generality and the level of the particular.

However, one of Hale's objections to the apoha theory in this volume questions whether it is ever possible to reach the level of generality from the level of the particular via exclusion. The problem is that at the basic level of the particular we refer to the particular using a proper name, such as Plato. Using nominally bound negation we arrive at non-Plato for all particulars that are not Plato. It is clear that all particulars that are non-Plato need not have anything in common. As Hale points out:

But there is a snag. Suppose n is any name. Then "x is non-n" will be true if and only if "x is not n" (i.e., ¬x = n) is true. So "x is not non-n" will be equivalent to "x is not not n" (i.e., ¬¬x = n), and so to "x is n" (i.e., x = n) after all. That is, the complex predicate ". . . is not non-n" can, it seems, be true of one and only one object, namely n itself -- so our attempt to exploit the combination of sentence and term negation to get a general predicate that clearly assumes no shared character but is potentially applicable to many objects seems to have fallen flat. (p. 266)

Hale's objection is aimed at the top-down approach of the apoha theory and he counters an interesting reply by Siderits to this objection which I cannot discuss here. However, Hale's objection might also apply to the bottom-up version of this theory. The problem is that at the basic level of particulars any sensation, for example a red sensation, can only be referred to by a name. This means that we will never be able to get from the particular sensation of red to the general concept of red because if "red" is the name of a particular sensation then "not non-red" will only apply to this particular sensation of red. Thus we would not have moved up to the level of the general quality red.

This book provides one of the first sustained discussions of the bottom-up version of the apoha theory and will no doubt pave the way for a lot of further discussion, not just for scholars of Buddhist philosophy but also for those working in the area of analytical philosophy and cognitive science. As such it will be essential reading for anyone interested in these areas for years to come.