Appearance in Reality

Heil Appearance In Reality

John Heil, Appearance in Reality, Oxford University Press, 2021, 258 pp., $70.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198865452.

Reviewed by Christopher S. Hill and Elizabeth Miller, Brown University 


I: Introduction

John Heil’s new book ranges over many of the major topics in metaphysics, including substance, properties, causation, space, time, parts and wholes, modality, essence, agency, and consciousness. It has interesting things to say about all of the issues it discusses, but there are three topics that are especially prominent in the book, and which help to organize the discussion. These all flow from the differences between our everyday, commonsense understanding of reality and the representations that are offered by science. In one form or another, the tension between the commonsense and scientific perspectives has been with us at least since Galileo; but Heil’s story begins in the twentieth century, with Arthur Eddington’s contrasting a familiar “commonplace” table that perception represents as solid, dense, and inert with the same table as represented by classical physics—a volume of mostly empty space, occupied only by “numerous electric charges rushing about with great speed” (Eddington 1928: ix-x). Some thirty years later, Wilfrid Sellars provided a new vocabulary for talking about the contrast in the following oft-quoted passage:

The philosopher is confronted not by one complex many-dimensional picture, the unity of which, such as it is, he must come to appreciate; but by two pictures of essentially the same order of complexity, each of which purports to be a complete picture of man-in-the-world, and which, after separate scrutiny, he must fuse into one vision. Let me refer to these two perspectives, respectively, as the manifest and the scientific images of man-in-the-world. (Sellars 1963: 5)

Putting this terminology to use, we can say that Heil’s three principal concerns, in the present book, are (i) to offer an interpretation of the main metaphysical commitments of the manifest image, (ii) to elaborate and compare several forms that the scientific image might take, and (iii) to explain the relationship between the two images. We will focus here on these three concerns, though in making this selection, we are leaving to one side much that is of independent interest.

As we see it, the discussions that are concerned with the scientific image are especially valuable parts of the book. Collectively, they would be a good choice for a text in a metaphysics course.

II: The Manifest Image

Heil’s treatment of this topic is a blend of explication and rational reconstruction. We will not attempt to separate these different aspects of his discussion here. Moreover, given space limitations, we will have to compress what is in fact a complex and nuanced disquisition into four short paragraphs.

According to Heil, the most fundamental categories recognized by the manifest image are those of property and substance. Properties are best seen as modes of substances, not as universals. Thus, unlike universals, they are not separable from substances—modes must be possessed by substances in order to exist. Moreover, again unlike universals, modes are not shareable by different substances. “When distinct objects ‘share’ a property, when they are ‘the same’ color or shape, for instance, this is a matter of the objects’ possessing similar or exactly similar modes” (30). In effect, then, the truthmakers for claims about properties, such as the generalization that all emeralds are green, are facts about relations of similarity. But the latter facts are not ground floor, for Heil also favors the view that facts involving relations are grounded in facts involving intrinsic properties, or modes (21, 28). (More on this view later.)

This account of properties parts company with many traditional views, so we stress the point that Heil means to be interpreting and reconstructing the manifest image, not providing a literal description.  

Another important feature of the manifest image is its treatment of causation, which, according to Heil, is plausibly regarded as Aristotelian rather than Humean. Assuming this interpretation is correct, Heil maintains, manifest causation is grounded in powers or dispositional tendencies of substances. This adds a new dimension to his treatment of properties. Properties are modes and modes are tendencies to affect other substances. According to this picture, the causal nexus of the universe is “the cooperative manifesting of powers” (15).

Heil’s account of substances begins with the traditional thesis that they are “metaphysically nondependent entities” (39). Heil then adds the claim that an entity with parts is metaphysically dependent on those parts, and goes on to infer that substances must be metaphysically simple entities—entities that do not have substances as their parts. It follows that commonplace objects like tables and flowers are not substances (46). Rather they are “complexes” of substances. Complexes are real, but they are “founded” entities rather than foundational entities, a status that prevents them from possessing properties. To be sure, there are true propositions applying predicates to complexes, but the truthmakers for such propositions are properties of the simple substances that serve as the complexes’ constituents (47).

III: The Scientific Image

Suppose we take up Heil’s suggestion that science, especially fundamental physics, gives a glimpse into the deeper natures of things—into the substances, properties, and (perhaps founded) relations strung together in our universe. What does science reveal about these natures? As science “is a work in progress”, Heil explores multiple candidates (39). He starts by applying his ontological categories to a somewhat idealized, but historically influential, corpuscular image familiar from classical physics. He then goes on to assess the structure and metaphysical commitments of more recent physical theories—specifically, general relativity and quantum mechanics.

Heil favors his Aristotelian inventory of empowering properties because it locates the truthmakers for ordinary causal and counterfactual claims in the natures of localized objects. According to Heil, this fits best not only with the image of reality that is familiar to us from our more ordinary engagement with, and within, the world, but also with the image presented in both the special sciences and a broadly corpuscular physics. If we opt instead for a Humean inventory of purely qualitative properties, any localized qualitied candidates prove inert. On such a view, claims seemingly about, say, this table’s solidity are, at best, made true not by the table’s  appropriately arranged, duly empowered, constituent particles, but rather by global patterns in the actual behaviors of qualitatively similar particles in broadly similar circumstances. For Heil, the result resonates with a sort of Spinozistic monism, according to which space-time itself is the unique substance, familiar objects are mere localized modes of this substance, and—since we are without any plurality of interacting substances—any efficient causation, or, perhaps better, the appearance thereof, is restricted to the manifest image.

Interestingly, however, Heil ends the book by questioning this apparent advantage of his Aristotelian metaphysics. He devotes his last chapters to exploring how his substance-property ontology can be brought to bear on some very different scientific images that, on his analysis, do suggest modifying our metaphysics to restrict efficient causation to the manifest image after all. One candidate builds on the suggestion, familiar from general relativity, that space-time itself has an intrinsic geometry and topology, or otherwise qualifies as a bearer of properties in its own right. According to Heil, this again supports a monistic picture on which space-time is the only substance, with more familiar objects as mere modes or aspects.

Another candidate builds on the non-local character of quantum mechanics. As Heil notes, there is widespread disagreement among philosophers of physics about how—and even if—to make metaphysical sense of entanglement. Some of their proposals also seem to pull towards a view on which the universe is a single substance, one cosmic system. Yet even those at least hoping to retain some plurality of substances still must accommodate, somehow or other, ineliminable correlations in the evolving dispositions of—sometimes quite far-flung—parts of entangled systems. According to Heil, “a Humean, having already moved beyond the thought that the arrangement evolves as it does owing to local causal interactions among its parts, is in a better place than an anti-Humean” here (211). 

Minimally, then, Heil takes both candidates to call into question what might have appeared, in the first stage, to be a significant advantage of the Aristotelian picture over its main rival. This part of Heil’s discussion is, of course, much more tentative, but he expresses increasing sympathy for what he comes to characterize as the “Spinoza-Williams-Lewis” view and, more generally, for the monism(s) of Spinoza and F.H. Bradley. His main contention, though, is that his ontological framework of propertied substances can accommodate whatever fundamental physics might throw at us. Come what may, this ontology remains a crucial resource for the work of integrating the manifest and scientific images.

IV: The Relationship between the Images

Heil begins his discussion of this topic by summarizing the three ways of approaching it that appear to have dominated the discussion so far:

(1) The manifest image is mere appearance, reality is as the scientific image says it is.

(2) The manifest image is non-negotiable, the scientific image is instrumentally useful, but not meant to be literally true.

(3) The manifest image describes higher-level, less-than-fundamental realities rooted in a fundamental, or relatively fundamental, reality addressed by the scientific image. (10)

Heil rejects all of these proposals. Option (1) dismisses the manifest image as a kind of illusion; but as Heil points out, this has the unintended consequence of undercutting any claim science might have to objective truth, since our means of testing scientific theories are ultimately grounded in manifest entities like electron microscopes and particle accelerators. “If the manifest image is illusory or in some fashion out of step with reality, what would that say about theories advanced under its auspices?” (Heil forthcoming: 6) The problem with (2) is that it would be very difficult to explain how science can be as hugely successful as it is in predicting events at the manifest level unless we suppose that it accurately reflects an underlying reality. How can mere fabrications generate truths? As for (3), in claiming that reality is arranged in a hierarchy of levels, with higher levels in some sense depending on lower ones, it introduces a dependency relation that has proved to resist elucidation. Thus, arguably, attempts to explain the relation in terms of supervenience or grounding are ultimately regressive. To illustrate, assuming that being a solid, dense, and inert table is a property in its own right, as option (3) implies, how could its instantiation be necessitated, as supervenience requires, by a largely empty volume containing whizzing particles? A similar question arises for grounding, which requires explanation of the instantiation of higher level properties by lower level properties. There seems to be no less of an explanatory gap between Eddington’s commonplace table and his scientific table than there is between consciousness and brain processes. (Heil forthcoming: 4–6) These problems involving supervenience and grounding seem to just be restatements of our original problem of the relationship between the two images. Moreover, a hierarchy of levels leaves us with the stubborn problem of explaining how causation works at higher levels. What room is there for attributing causal powers to manifest tables if the powers of the corresponding scientific entities are sufficient to explain why one state of the world is succeeded by another?

These are Heil’s reasons for seeking a fourth alternative. In the event, he considers two related proposals about the form that such an alternative might take. (He may regard them as different versions of the same idea.) One version appeals to the truthmaker relation:

The scientific image, roughly what you have in physics, undertakes to provide an exacting account of what the manifest [image] is an image of, the nature of the truthmakers for truths issuing from the manifest image, their natural ontology. (236)

Thus, on this truthmaker proposal, the manifest image consists of propositions that are largely true, but the entities on which their truth ultimately depends may have natures that are not deeply captured by the image. It is science that, potentially at least, gives us the deepest truths about those entities. Heil illustrates how truthmakers might diverge from expectations based on true propositions by claiming that certain relational propositions, such as the proposition that Gus is taller than Lilian, are made true by facts involving only intrinsic properties, such as the fact that Lilian is 1.6 meters in height and Gus is 1.7 meters. The truthmaker proposal is quite prominent in the book, making appearances on pages 6, 16, 212, 216, 218, and 228, in addition to the page (236) from which we have just quoted. 

The other proposal about the relationship between the images is what might be called perspectival pluralism. This proposal is less prominent in the book, but it comes vividly to the fore in Heil’s other writings. Here is an illustrative passage:

Following Spinoza and Davidson (and, I believe, Leibniz), my suggestion is that the manifest image and the scientific images depict one and the same cosmos in distinct ways. You could think of the scientific image as taking up a view from nowhere, a perspective on the cosmos sub specie aeternitatis. The manifest image, in contrast, issues from a vantage point within the cosmos, a perspective sub specie temporis. These perspectives are no more in competition than your everyday perspective on a tomato is in competition with a chemist’s perspective on the tomato viewed under a scanning electron microscope. Both are ways of regarding one and the same tomato, both are, or can be, veridical. (Heil forthcoming: 13)

Suppose we say that the manifest and scientific images are theories. Then the idea is that reality consists of entities that are the truthmakers for both of these theories, each theory arising from a proprietary perspective on the same universe (cf. 211–15). It is immediately clear that this proposal is compatible with the foregoing truthmaker proposal, and reflection shows that the proposals are in fact closely related.

Heil’s two proposals seem initially to be promising new steps, and Heil is to be thanked for calling attention to them and trying them on for size. It seems to us, however, that on a closer look, they can be seen to reinstate the original problem in new guises.

Consider the truthmaker proposal. If we assume, as realism about tables seems to demand, that manifest image propositions about tables are made true by tables, then the truthmaker proposal boils down to the claim that the scientific image gives us a deeper account of the nature of tables. But this seems simply to return us to the original problem: given the apparent discrepancies between the manifest and scientific accounts of tables, how is it possible for the latter to be an account of the same things as the former? Further, we doubt that Heil’s example of relational claims being made true by intrinsic properties can help him here. Arguably, the proposition that Gus is taller than Lilian is made true, not just by the fact that Lilian is 1.6 meters in height and Gus is 1.7 meters, but rather by that fact in conjunction with the a priori relational fact that 1.7 is a larger number than 1.6.

Turning to perspectival pluralism, we encounter the question of how it is possible for manifest and scientific theories to have the same truthmakers. After all, where one theory says “solid, dense, and inert,” the other one says “largely empty space occupied by whizzing particles.” Recall that Heil favors an attitude of realism toward both images. Because of this, it has to be possible for both of these attributions to be true, and, moreover, true of the same entities. But how?

We hope that Heil will say more about his proposals, perhaps addressing our concerns, in future work.


Eddington, A. S. The Nature of the Physical World. New York: The Macmillan Co, 1928.

 Heil, John. “Metaphysics Speaks for Itself.” Unpublished manuscript.

Sellars, W. “Philosophy and the Scientific Image of Man,” in Science, Perception, and Reality. London: Routledge and Kegan Paul: 1–40, 1963.