Appearances of the Good: An Essay on the Nature of Practical Reason

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Sergio Tenenbaum, Appearances of the Good: An Essay on the Nature of Practical Reason, Cambridge University Press, 2007, 315pp., $80.00 (hbk), ISBN 0521837839.

Reviewed by Kieran Setiya, University of Pittsburgh


The doctrine that we act and desire "under the guise of the good" has the curious distinction of being a dogma in moral psychology whose falsehood is often dogmatically assumed. Those who accept the doctrine -- like Sergio Tenenbaum, in this important book -- tend to regard its rejection as a matter of orthodoxy. Those who deny it regard its acceptance in a similar way.

Perhaps both sides are in the right. The guise of the good is supported by the bulk of the Western philosophical tradition, beginning with the Socratic paradox that no one errs willingly, through Plato and Aristotle, to Kant's "old formula of the schools": we desire only what we conceive to be good, and avoid only what we conceive to be bad (1). Yet it survives for the most part in attenuated forms. Think of the familiar view that acting for a reason is acting on a consideration one takes to be a reason for whatever one is doing, a requirement that leaves room for akrasia, listlessness or motivational inertia, and for desiring the bad. If anything is orthodox, it is the occupation of this middle ground, opposed by more radical critics of the guise of the good and by its radical advocates alike.

Tenenbaum provides an attractively uncompromising instance of the latter. On his "scholastic" conception of practical reason, "desiring X is to be identified with X appearing to be good to the agent (from an evaluative perspective)" (14) and intention with unconditional judgement of the good (66), where "good" means something like "to be done." In the course of defending these claims, he offers a sustained and much-needed investigation of a fundamental topic, ranging from questions about the explanation of action in the philosophy of mind to the status of deontological principles in ethics. The discussion is characterized throughout by an impressive clarity, a sharp sense of distinctions and subtleties that are easy to neglect, and an expert invocation of historical figures. (As well as the obvious debts, Tenenbaum adapts crucial arguments from Descartes and Kant.) This is a book it would be difficult to read without profit.

Tenenbaum's strategy is in large part defensive. Although he presents considerations in favour of the scholastic conception -- in particular, an argument about the role of "intelligibility" in psychological explanation, to which I return below -- he does not attempt a proof. Instead, he concentrates on two sources of resistance to the evaluative conception of intention and desire: the "separatist" charge that it cannot account for the psychological possibility of akrasia, depression and perversity, among other things; and "contemporary subjectivism." On the face of it, the picture of desire as an appearance of the good is one on which we are committed, in desiring something, to the existence of non-instrumental reasons for its pursuit -- reasons that do not turn on the fact that it is an object of final desire. In its harshest form, the objection from the subjectivity of value is that there are no such reasons. Tenenbaum carefully brings out just how implausible this is, and how much at odds with common sense (see, for instance, his treatment of the instrumental principle at 76-90, and of practical error at 119-23). The more modest objection is that our desires sometimes affect the landscape of reasons in a way that does not depend on prior reasons for those desires. Tenenbaum takes this appearance seriously, arguing that it represents a form of "authority-subjectivism" consistent with the scholastic view (132-44). That I judge something to be good, or that it appears good to me -- that is, intention or desire -- can help to make it good, when the judgement is the product of a merely permissive inference, when my endorsement of X as good is conditional on how it seems, or when my desire has the corresponding self-referential content (it appears that: X is good only if and when it so appears). Tenenbaum's meticulous exploration of these possibilities is a useful corrective to the assumption that desires could be either perceptions or sources of value, but never both.

The idea of a merely permissive inference deserves some comment. In the background is a picture of rational agents forming a "general conception of the good [… ] in light of the various perspectives on the good manifested in [their] desires" (26). One's intentions, as unconditional evaluative judgements, ought to be governed by this conception -- although discrepancies are not impossible. The correctness of one's general conception of the good is determined by its conformity to proper procedures of formation on the basis of one's desires, formal and informal principles of practical inference, and so on. Thus, there is room for idealized agents to have different but equally correct conceptions of the good, as when they are formed on the basis of an inference that permits a certain reflective judgement without requiring it. This picture supports a distinction between "impersonal goods," which belong to any correct conception of the good, and "personal goods," which belong to some but not all of them (181-2).

It is in this context that Tenenbaum confronts the so-called "paradox of deontology." Can we make sense of familiar sorts of moral rule -- against killing one person to deter someone else from killing two -- without concluding, implausibly, that it is sometimes wrong to bring about the greatest impersonal good? Unlike some others, Tenenbaum cannot refuse the charge of implausibility: his scholastic conception implies that we must always bring about whatever is good. Instead, he denies that the impersonal good is independent of moral rules; it is, in his terminology, a "deontological good" (201). Tenenbaum's illustration of this claim appeals to Kantian themes, but it bears a resemblance to Philippa Foot's well-known argument that the "greatest good" must be explained in terms of the virtues of character, and therefore cannot conflict with the demands of justice.[1] Roughly speaking, the suggestion is that the impersonal good is what would be conceived as good by someone whose ends conform to the categorical imperative; nothing can count as impersonally good that such an agent would not regard as "to be done." Thus, if the categorical imperative forbids killing one to save two -- as Tenenbaum assumes for the sake of argument -- an agent does not forgo the impersonal good in obeying it (218-222).[2]

The remainder of the book turns from ethics to action theory, responding to the "separatist" challenge. A lot of work is done simply by distinguishing desires from beliefs about the good. Since desires are mere appearances, they are sometimes disregarded: we can desire what we know to be bad. Tenenbaum goes on to make a more subtle distinction, which I found harder to grasp. In attributing desires, as appearances of the good, to both non-human animals and human infants, he suggests that such "natural agents" not only "pursue things as if they were good" (247) but "conceive [them] to be good, even if they do not have as the content of any of their representations that a certain object is good" (248). If this makes sense, it helps the scholastic view to deal with a worrying objection, that we do attribute desires to infants and to other animals, and not just in the metaphorical sense in which we sometimes attribute desires to inanimate machines. But it is obviously puzzling: how can I conceive something as good without the corresponding representation?

A similar obscurity appears in the idea of intention as unconditional evaluative judgement, which is again distinguished from the belief that X is good (73-5). The argument for this claim rests on the "simplifying assumption that 'X is good' is equivalent to the unqualified 'X ought to be held to be good.'" Thus, "the belief 'X is good' is the same as the belief 'I ought to hold X to be good.'" (74) But, of course, one may believe that one ought to hold X to be good when one does not. It follows that believing that X is good is distinct from holding it to be good, the unconditional evaluative judgement that constitutes intention. The problem with this argument is that it is too general. If we make the "simplifying assumption" that 'p' is equivalent to 'p ought to be believed,' we can use it to distinguish the belief that p from itself. After all, one can believe that one ought to believe something when one does not. 

What lies behind these troubling remarks about intention and desire is a formal analogy between practical and theoretical reason on which practical attitudes aim at the good in something like the way that belief aims at the truth. To believe that p is to conceive it as true that p, although the concept of truth need not figure in the content of that belief; the belief that p is not the belief that p is true. For Tenenbaum, there is a similar relation between desire or intention and the good. The analogy is helpful, however, only if we have a sufficiently clear account of what is meant by saying that belief aims at the truth -- a slogan that is widely endorsed, but whose interpretation is a matter of dispute. Without more details, it is impossible to know whether "good" can stand to a psychological attitude as "true" stands to belief, or whether, in doing so, it would vindicate the old formula of the schools. Is it enough for the analogy that desires are defective by the standards of practical reason when their objects are bad -- as beliefs are defective when their objects are false? That seems to fall short of the scholastic conception: it is consistent with a moral psychology that gives "separatists" everything they want.

The analogy between practical and theoretical reason is more successfully deployed, I think, in Tenenbaum's discussion of akrasia. Drawing on Descartes' Meditations, he introduces a distinction between "oblique" cognition, in which I represent that there is sufficient reason for some belief, and "direct" cognition, in which I grasp the reasons themselves, and understand (or seem to understand) why and how they demonstrate its truth (268-74). While the distinction is initially applied to philosophical and geometrical proofs, where oblique but not direct cognition leaves room for epistemic akrasia, Tenenbaum urges its extension to the practical realm. It is when one loses touch with the reasons themselves, and merely knows that they exist, that one's intention or unconditional evaluative judgement can diverge from one's general conception of the good (274-82). This helps to make sense of something left mysterious by Davidson's otherwise parallel account of clear-eyed akrasia, namely "how one could succumb to [the] obvious mistake" of making an all-out judgement that conflicts with one's reflective assessment of reasons (262). Here, as in his illuminating discussions of depression and perversity, Tenenbaum shows that the scholastic view is compatible with non-tendentious descriptions of the relevant phenomena. It cannot be refuted simply by appeal to intuitions of psychological possibility.

The dispute about the guise of the good therefore turns to theory: "Is there anything we can say in favor of the old formula of the schools in the context of intentional explanations?" (9) Tenenbaum's response is that we can, if we think of such explanations as ones in which an action is made intelligible as "the expression of a rational, albeit imperfectly rational, will." (10) On the scholastic conception, explaining action by appeal to intention or desire is explaining it in terms of judgements or appearances of the good. Even when my judgement is wrong or appearances are deceptive, so that my action is less than fully rational, an explanation of this kind "displays [my] behavior as aspiring to conform to the norms and ideals of rationality." (15) In this way, it helps to bring out the intelligibility of what I am doing. If action can be made intelligible only when its explanation conforms to the scholastic model, and Tenenbaum is right about the distinctive character of intentional explanations, this model must be true: nothing else makes proper sense of what we do.

It is not clear, however, that this argument works. Even if we accept the demand for intelligibility in the explanation of action, we might look for other ways in which it could be met. After all, we can ask whether it is intelligible that something appears to be good in the first place, and here the answer will not always rely on further appearances of the good. Tenenbaum is emphatic about this himself, as when he identifies desire with an appearance of the good "from an evaluative perspective," in which it hangs together with other desires: "Placing a desire in the context of its perspective is not [… ] to provide a further reason for the agent's action or to describe a further good pursued by the agent." (44) If it can be intelligible that someone has a certain desire without its being formed because it was judged or appeared to be good, why can't an action be made intelligible in much the same way? Why can't it be understood as approximating to rationality, or to being as it ought to be, even though its subject fails to represent it as doing so? Matters are complicated by the distinction marked above, according to which the object of intention or desire may be "conceived" as good without being represented as such. If this distinction could be made precise, it might turn out that the weaker condition must be satisfied by attitudes that help to make action intelligible. Perhaps it will even turn out that the scholastic conception of practical reason is equivalent to the claim that intentional explanations of action reveal it as approximating to norms and ideals of rationality, to which the agent tacitly aspires. Either way, we are confronted here with a fundamental question in the philosophy of action, about the alleged "normativity" of reasons-explanations. It is a dispute that has implications for philosophical naturalism, for epistemology, and for the nature of practical reason. And while Tenenbaum's book does not resolve the question, it is an extremely useful place for its examination to begin.


[1] Philippa Foot, "Utilitarianism and the Virtues," Mind 94 (1985): 196-209

[2] Tenenbaum goes on to argue, much less plausibly, that bringing about the killing of one to prevent the killing of two is an aspect of the Kantian impersonal good, since an agent whose ends conform to the categorical imperative would prefer it. He is oddly undeterred by the consequence that, although I should not kill one to save two, I should be willing to bring it about that I do so by using myself as an instrument (223-4).