Applying Wittgenstein

Placeholder book cover

Rupert Read, Applying Wittgenstein, Laura Cook (ed.), Continuum, 2007, 187pp., $130.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780826494504.

Reviewed by Colin Johnston, Institute of Philosophy, University of London


Not long after his return to Cambridge in 1929 Wittgenstein was recorded as saying that "it did not matter whether his results were true or not: what mattered was that "a method had been found"" (Moore 1955, 26). Wittgenstein's first concern throughout his later career was to advocate a philosophical method; his philosophical results could, if challenged, more readily be modified or withdrawn. A philosopher, then, can advance Wittgenstein's cause by practicing his method as much as by pressing Wittgenstein's results. To do this, to do philosophy after Wittgenstein, is Rupert Read's ambition in his book Applying Wittgenstein.

Of course, Read is not the first philosopher to have had this ambition. He claims originality, however, "in the … resolute character of my treatment of the topics I treat of, to some extent in the particularity of those topics, and of course in the particular way in which I have melded them -- or, allowed them to meld" (176). The word 'resolute' here refers to a reading of the Tractatus offered by Cora Diamond which aims to take with full seriousness Wittgenstein's description of his Tractarian propositions as nonsense. The propositions of the Tractatus, Diamond presses, are to be taken not as pointers to matters ineffable but simply as failures to mean anything. Consonant with this, Read's diverse discussions -- of language, modernist literature, psychopathology and time -- are characterised by an idea that nonsense should not be treated as anything other than an absence of sense.

Before applying Wittgenstein to these topics, Read begins his book with an interpretation of Wittgenstein's proposal that the meaning of a word may be defined as its use in the language (PI §43). Read's central claim here is that from the time of the Notebooks onwards Wittgenstein was involved in a distinction between "the merely formal "sense" of expressions and the "meaning" of their actual uses" (13). Roughly, an expression's formal sense is its place in a static, background grammar where its meaning is a matter of dynamic, locally constituted grammar. It has been a common mistake of Wittgenstein scholars, Read suggests, to identify meaning with formal sense and, offering a theory of formal sense, simply to ignore local use. Read does not however provide his distinction with much clarity, nor does he make a good case for its attribution to Wittgenstein.

Considering the early Wittgenstein, Read cites a discussion in the Notebooks of a picture of two figures fencing. "The proposition in picture-writing", Wittgenstein writes, "can be true and false. It has a sense independent of its truth or falsehood" (NB 7). Read responds:

I take it as obvious that the "proposition in picture writing's" truth or falsehood is something that would be discovered in its use or application, in its representation of some actual state of affairs, in which case it would be either true or false. But, as this "proposition" is unapplied, it has, independently of any such use, a more neutral "sense", which one might conceive of as its purely grammatical "form", that one might say can be 'both true and false'. This is to say that the "proposition in picture writing" is not truly a proposition at all, but is instead an example, an exposed and exhibited expression that would be a proposition only if and when it were applied to or held to represent something. This application can seem to be always beyond the grasp of any staticist theorization. (12)

This is an eccentric response to Wittgenstein's discussion. To begin with, Wittgenstein does not deploy hereabouts a notion of propositional use or application. Second, the idea that the proposition has for Wittgenstein a 'neutral' sense independent of its use as a representation sits uncomfortably with Wittgenstein's comment three days later that: "We can say straight away: Instead of: this proposition has such and such a sense: this proposition represents such and such a situation" (NB 8, c.f. TLP §4.031). If Read's suggestion is that Wittgenstein has two notions of sense in play, he needs to build a much stronger exegetical case. If it is not, he needs to explain how many other passages in which Wittgenstein talks of sense do not, despite appearances, rule out his interpretation of the notion. Third, there seems no barrier to reading the passage not as saying that a proposition, with its neutral sense, can be used to say something true and can be used to say something false but rather as a more or less straightforward precursor to the Tractarian line that a picture bears its sense independently of its truth or falsity which is discovered only by comparing it, with its sense, to reality (TLP §§2.2-2.225). These criticisms of an isolated passage might be felt to be somewhat uncharitable. The passage constitutes, however, Read's only support for attributing his distinction between 'merely formal sense' and 'genuinely dynamical meaning' to the early Wittgenstein.

Turning to the later Wittgenstein, Read considers the remark in Philosophical Investigations that "naming is not so far a move in the language game" (PI §49) and suggests that namings form part of the static grammar which Wittgenstein contrasts with meaningful, dynamic grammar. His clearest account of this latter grammar is then given as follows:

Someone ("A") comes into the house from a walk and says, "The leaves have begun to change." In these circumstances, this remark would in all probability count as an "empirical proposition"… . [Such empirical propositions] allow for additional discourse, for further description… . "A" can for instance now add, "The maples, especially on high ground, are changing more than the oaks." Of course, "A" might have said just that upon walking in, without first declaring that the leaves had begun to change; but he would have done so with rather less probability of being understood, at least without pause or surprise. Thus an empirical observation -- "The leaves have begun to change" -- may come to function in relation to the expressions that follow it as, roughly, a grammatical stipulation. In this development the role of such expressions changes 'dialectically' from active to 'static', from a temporarily descriptive and even "referential" functioning to a new and undoubted grammatical establishment, a background or "foundation" against which one can make another empirical and testable observation. (21)

Read intends, I think, a comparison to the development of a game of chess. What moves are possible at a certain point in a game of chess depends upon the state of the game -- something at which one arrives through the previous play. There may be some mileage in an idea of this kind. Read does not, however, develop his thoughts beyond the outline just cited. Moreover, Read acknowledges that their attribution to the later Wittgenstein is without good textual support (specifically, he acknowledges that Wittgenstein did not make such claims in Philosophical Investigations (23), and further that the time frame Wittgenstein had in mind in On Certainty when he considered the possibility that a "proposition may get treated at one time as something to test experience by, at another as a rule of testing" (OC §98) is markedly longer than that of a conversational exchange (22)), and so he retreats to the claim that Wittgenstein would not have found them wrongheaded (23). We are left wondering where we have arrived.

Help is not forthcoming here as the book proceeds. It is apposite to prelude one's applications of Wittgensteinian method with a discussion of his notion of meaningful use. Wittgenstein's primary methodological directive is that to learn in philosophy we need to look at a word's use. Sorting out what it is we are supposed to look at before proceeding with the looking is an obviously good plan. Read does not, however, feed his idea of dynamic grammatical developments into the subsequent discussions in any visible way. What dominates these discussions instead is, as mentioned, an idea that there is no such thing as a sentence's saying something nonsensical. A sentence which is found not to make sense is to be considered as not saying anything at all.

Bringing this idea to the area of literature, Read provides a reading of Wallace Stevens' poem "Thirteen Ways of Looking at a Blackbird". Stevens invites us to believe, Read suggests, that we can make sense of his poem's stanzas. On closer inspection, however, we find that we cannot and it is in this illusion of sense and its subsequent dispelling that the poem has its effect. Moving to psychopathology, Read considers Louis Sass' account of the character of schizophrenic delusions. Sass proposes that such delusions can usefully be understood as similar to the delusions of a philosopher drawn into solipsism, only in the case of the schizophrenic the delusions are 'lived out' rather than merely asserted. Endorsing this line for the most part, Read adds to it the claim that the philosophical solipsist fails to say anything with his sentences and, following this, that the actions, words and experiences of the severely mentally ill do not bear any understanding. The discussion is varied and lively and some imaginative connections are made. At the key moments, though, where we would have wanted a full discussion of why or how the solipsist's or schizophrenic's words do not bear understanding, what we find are undeveloped, general ideas such as "we must be wary of taking seriously -- of thinking we can interpret -- what there is/are no clear criteria for, no clear criteria for evaluation of" (74), mixed up with such uncashed out assertions as:

'Quasi-thought', thought or talk in the nowhere 'beyond' the limits of thought, consisting of quasi-thoughts which are, roughly, 'logically alien', which can only be mentally compassed through an overly hopeful and presumptuous process of analogy, or through imaginative mental projection of quite dubious status, is 'simply' not, strictly speaking, to be regarded as comprehensible. (74)

There is a similar lack of attempt at demonstration in Read's discussion of Dummett in his final chapter on time. Dummett (2000) makes the case that modelling physical magnitudes changing over time as functions on the classical continuum of real numbers implies the conceptual possibility of conceptually impossible states of affairs. It implies, for example, that it is a conceptual possibility for an object to be at a certain place at all times between t1 and t2 other than at the instant (t1+t2)/2 when it is located somewhere quite different. As a result, this 'classical model of time' fails. Read complains that Dummett's line here involves 'irresolution':

Dummett thinks, apparently, that he sort-of understands the classical model of time. It has enough sense, he thinks, for him to understand why it is 'ultimately nonsense', what it is 'trying to say'. I think that that 'thought' of Dummett's is nonsense. (83)

Again, though, Read does not explain why he thinks this. On its face, the classical model of time can be understood and criticised in precisely the way Dummett recommends. We can take a classically definable function such as f(x)=0 if x0 and f(x)=1 if x=0 and then argue that, if we were to model physical magnitudes over time as functions on the classical continuum of reals, this particular function would not represent an intelligible state of affairs. If Dummett's line is misconceived then we need to be shown wherein the misconception lies.

The inadequacy of Read's attack is compounded by a failure from the outset to understand his target. Where Dummett describes how, in classical as opposed to intuitionistic mathematics, the real line is defined as the set of (independently defined) real numbers, and explains that this is how the classical mathematician cashes out her metaphor that the real line is composed of individual real numbers, Read radically mistakes Dummett's discussion and claims without argument that the metaphor in view here "'cannot' be cashed out in any way in that the casher-outer will accept as fulfilling the totality of his original purposes in putting forward the metaphor" (83). Having thus set himself inadvertently against classical mathematics, Read fails to recover and shows no understanding at all of how Dummett takes time, on its classical model, to be composed of durationless instants. 

Each part of Read's book draws heavily on previously published papers and the result is not a meld, as he claims, but rather a hotchpotch. A simple collection of those papers with a substantial introduction would, so far as I can see, have served Read's purposes equally well. More, the book's prose style is thoroughly awkward and its content largely disappointing. Read complains that Wittgenstein's connection of meaning and use in Philosophical Investigations §43 "has been by some too easily -- and crudely and sloganistically -- adopted" (8). Read has himself, however, too easily -- and crudely and sloganistically -- adopted Diamond et al.'s discussions of nonsense and the Tractatus. Finally, it is not obvious how what Read is doing through the large majority of his book is applying Wittgensteinian method. Whilst there are intermittent glimpses of grammatical investigation after Wittgenstein (see in particular the last two paragraphs of section 3.1.7), it remains unclear how the book as a whole might be taken as "a set of exercises in therapy" (1).


Dummett, M.: 2000, 'Is Time a Continuum of Instants?', Philosophy 75, 497-515.

Moore, G.E.: 1955, 'Wittgenstein's Lectures in 1930-1933', Mind 64, 1-27.

Wittgenstein, L.: 1922, Tractatus Logico-Philosophicus, tr. Ogden, Routledge, London. Cited as TLP.

Wittgenstein, L.: 1953, Philosophical Investigations, tr. Anscombe, ed. Anscombe and Rhees, Blackwell, Oxford. Cited as PI.

Wittgenstein, L.: 1998, Notebooks 1914-1916, ed. Anscombe and Wright, Blackwell, Oxford. Cited as NB.

Wittgenstein, L.: 1975, On Certainty, ed. Anscombe and Wright, Blackwell, Oxford. Cited as OC.