Apprehension: Reason in the Absence of Rules

Placeholder book cover

Holt, Lynn, Apprehension: Reason in the Absence of Rules, Ashgate Publishing Company, 2002, 120pp, $29.95 (pbk), ISBN 0754606643.

Reviewed by Guy Axtell , University of Nevada, Reno


In Apprehension, Lynn Holt argues for “a conception of reason in which reason is primarily apprehensive, secondarily discursive and calculative” (3). Holt finds his inspiration in Aristotle, wherein “the authority of the virtuous, the authority of the expert, is the hallmark of an Aristotelian account of reason” (95). This approach underscores the priority of person over principle and of understanding over rule, in all areas of expert practice. But in constructing a virtue epistemology for the modern philosophical era, Holt also explicitly takes leave of Aristotle in numerous respects, arguing that practical reasoning and practical wisdom are primary over theory, and showing how the “intellectual” virtues and those of “character” are more holistically related than Aristotle himself allowed. While sweeping in scope, Apprehension is well-grounded in historical case study; the author's call for a return to the resources of classical philosophy is supported by his historical account of how twentieth-century analytic philosophy came to inherit the ills that befell modernism through its wholesale rejection of Aristotelianism (4).

Holt deserves applause for a book which combines a well-articulated line of argument with an engaging and varied expository style. His style is reserved and succinct, without needless recurrence. Because of this the author accomplishes a great deal more than many authors would in a short text of 120 pages. This book will appeal to epistemologists and metaphysicians, and to those with strong interdisciplinary interests, as Holt blends his neo-Aristotelianism with a range of previous research interests in rationality theory, scientific discovery, and social psychology.

What may be most distinctive about the author's understanding of the value of virtue epistemology for contemporary philosophers is that he locates epistemological interests in a very different conceptual space from that of analytic philosophy; indeed the critique of analytic philosophy that he offers is sharp-edged, pointing towards an alternative in which many traditional problems of epistemologists are either transformed or rendered irrelevant:

… conceiving reason as essentially apprehensive both requires different conceptual resources than those from which contemporary analytic philosophy draws, and entails very different accounts of the rationality of science and concepts like objectivity and truth. (112-113)

Partly for this reason the author spends his time developing themes such as “the epistemic role of apprehension,” and “the rationality of scientific discovery and experiment” by directly relating them to a neo-Aristotelian background, without drawing substantially on the work of other self-described contemporary virtue epistemologists.

Apprehension is chosen as a focal term in part because, “unlike 'intuition' or 'nous', [it] is not bound to any one philosophical tradition” (3). In the broader sense of the term utilized in the above passage, Holt believes it to be the sole intellectual virtue. But he allows it to be differentiated and identifies the more expressly apprehensive virtues as wisdom, practical wisdom, perception, imagination, and understanding. These he distinguishes both from innate faculties and dispositions and from non-apprehensive elements of expertise such as calculative reasoning and technical skills. Here as elsewhere, the author is admirably straightforward whenever he takes leave of Aristotle's own account. All of the intellectual virtues are apprehensive for Aristotle, Holt holds, yet by placing apprehensive character most explicitly under understanding (nous) and practical wisdom (phronesis), his discussions have had “the unfortunate effect of making understanding and practical wisdom seem very different from science (episteme) and craft (techne)” (15). To correct this, Holt emphasizes that science (episteme) is an achievement for Aristotle, and itself a virtue attributed to individuals; he also tries to show that for Aristotle's account to be successful, nous must be a virtue. This is partly illustrated by discussion of the similarities and differences between Copernicus and the Ptolemaics. Copernicus' system was in some respects a technical failure, yet the primary achievements which separates Copernicus from Ptolemy regard his understanding of the principles and presuppositions of his field, and his use of imagination: “What separates Copernicus from other Ptolemaic astronomers is his apprehension both of the current state of high astronomy and how that same astronomy might be transformed and reformed if certain less than fundamental elements were abandoned” (86).

But part of what Holt argues can be countered and corrected by the resources of his aretaic approach is the narrow conception of reason that entered with the mechanistic new science of the 17th century. “When method supplanted virtue in the early modern philosophical imagination, it did so in combination with a strong movement against Scholasticism, when Aristotelianism was perceived to have been corrupted” (3). Here the author's defense of the priority of virtues over rules and apprehension over inferential reason is buttressed by his reading of the early-modern fascination with and appeal to “method”:

Thinkers in other ways as diverse as Francis Bacon and Rene Descartes both wished to extend this conception to the new sciences, conceiving the application of reason in science as a scientific method: a set of rules of inference which, if followed exactly, will lead to truth. This conception was enormously popular at the dawn of the (so-called) scientific revolution, and as a guiding heuristic in the intervening centuries via such rubrics as 'The Scientific Method', a notion which nicely captures the scientism and Methodism which have dominated philosophical thought about reason and rationality in the last four centuries. (2)

The older ideal of intellectual virtue and the epistemic authority that it confers did not survive the seventeenth century except as a minority position. It was eschewed with the reaction against title, position, and privileged authority, generally. A new understanding of reason as calculative and machine-like was emerging with both rationalist and empiricist versions; this new mechanical philosophy envisioned impersonal standards of rationality and indeed insisted—famously in Descartes—that reason is equally-divided. The socio-political appeal of a more 'democratic' conception of reason is in some ways obvious, but the author insists that it obscures the essential correctness of the Aristotelian insight that “character matters in inquiry” and that experts do not need rules for practice except as shorthand or as a means of transmitting techniques to novices. In the reaction against Scholasticism,

the authority of persons was meant to be supplanted with impersonal authority: scripture supplants the Pope, laws supplant the King, method supplants the Philosopher. When Kant suggested that people should reason for themselves, he did not mean that they should reason idiosyncratically: they should rather reason according to universal laws binding for all. This only reinforces the point that Methodism was all the rage: it was consonant, indeed it was the intellectual counterpart, of political and religious reform. The rule of law—in legal codes, in scripture, in scientific methods—was thus a hallmark of the period. (95)

Holt's historical thesis of the neglect of the virtues and personal authority in favor of impersonal rules of method leads him not just to be critical of the leveling idea of “democracy of the intellect,” but to seek an altogether different account of the rationality of science, and of “objectivity” more generally.

This sort of mechanistic inquiry simply leaves no room for the characteristic frailties of human reasoning. Method secures objectivity as detachment, for it equally detaches novices from their inferiority and experts from their superior ability. (103)

Holt's interest is accordingly not in normal psychology but in that of the expert in any particular field of inquiry, whether scientific or otherwise. He argues against the separation of emotion and rationality and for a conception of objectivity that “entails, contra its standard presentation, a condition of character” (104). This is the difference between a model in which disinterestedness and impartiality is sufficient for objectivity, and one in which objectivity requires a kind of proper attunement to one's context of inquiry, supported by positive virtues of understanding, honesty, perseverance, etc.

In Holt's thought objectivity is closely connected with the authority of expertise, because, while the virtues are in us potentially, there are wide differences in character and competence; the intellectual virtues come to be actualized in us only through proper development, which generally requires education and training. This perspective is represented as an attempt to make good philosophical sense of Aristotle's claim that there is no more ultimate criterion for truth and objectivity than the achievement of the individual who possesses virtue. Such an achievement is a rare thing, but “means that a genuine virtue epistemology ought properly to be regarded as a virtuoso epistemology: an account of who is best able to judge truth from falsity in virtue of his or her possession of wisdom” (73).

With respect to scientific rationality and matters of discovery, then, there is a “priority of understanding over rule” (96); proposed rule sets are not predictive of how the experts will handle new cases; experts really rely on their experience, their trained intuitive judgment. It is only after the fact that the authority of the expert becomes precedent, and can be codified as a rule. “Apprehension is the element of intellectual expertise which, while it defies reduction to rules, is itself the source of rules of reason properly circumscribed” (42). So with an apprehensive account of reason, the problem of conceiving how scientific discovery could be rational is not the problem of supplying a logic or methodology; it is rather a question of tracing discovery to the appropriate apprehensive act and virtues. On such an account no invidious distinction is drawn between discovery and justification, since “To make a discovery is to be justified, precisely because the discovery flows from virtuous activity” (88).

In assessing Holt's wide-ranging study, this reader finds himself drawn to his (MacIntyrean) understanding of rationality as embedded in practice (8), to the priority he assigns to practical over theoretical reasoning, and to his rather holistic conception of the virtues. Holt concedes the failure of “intuition” as typically conceived by its supporters, and nicely traverses the contemporary field in attempting to differentiate apprehensive virtue from intuition. Although apprehension defined as “seeing things 'as'“ or just seeing how things hang together (39) must surely face some of the same objections that intuition commonly does, I would prefer to focus on some different concerns with his text.

One is the way in which Holt wants to differentiate himself from others doing research within virtue epistemology. He does so by painting them with the same brush he paints analytic philosophy generally. In this he seems to neglect that not all of those who engage what Michael Williams calls the “analytic problem,” or the question, “What is knowledge?” are necessarily 'analytic epistemologists'. Moreover, where he does offer a specific critique, it is that “said epistemology thus fails to conceive virtue correctly, assimilating it either to a skill which anyone could learn or a reliable mechanism anyone could possess” (3). Holt instead views virtue as “an achievement available only to a few with the right combination of potential, education, experience and hard work” (3). But in siding with an account of virtue as acquired, and against reliabilist or “dispositional” accounts of virtue, Holt is already taking positions that associate him with some figures in the field (Zagzebski, for instance) and distance him from others (like Sosa), though he does not seem self-aware about this.

Some of those who fall to criticism in this regard do not favor Methodism, the key ill Holt associates with analytic philosophy. A Particularism akin to his own stance is favored by some, and is not wholly second-fiddle in 20th century Anglo-American epistemology. But few particularist accounts are as immoderate as Holt's, which reinforces the idea that the elite person of virtue is the ultimate judge of truth and objectivity. This leads me to query whether the author's account may be most troubled exactly where it is most distinctive. Apprehension clearly raises issues of seminal importance in an age of expertise like our own. But the concern that I have about 'elitism' in his approach is hoisted by perception of vagueness and lack of content in the notion of apprehension as he uses it.

Holt worries that “if virtues were faculties, every 'normal' person would possess them, just like every 'normal' person has eyes. But as we have noted, the virtuous person sets norms for Aristotle, and it would be a mistake to transfer that norm setting function to the 'normal,' i.e. ordinary person” (14). I do not find that this satisfactorily justifies Holt's proposed shift in epistemology away from “normal” psychology onto that of the “expert.” The shift here seems tantamount to a strong anti-naturalism, in that it places the norm-setting function in the particular judgments of the individual of genius, thereby insulating it from social-scientific scrutiny.

I am not suggesting, as many have, that all normativity be rested on evolution—that dispositions all be appraised by the extent to which they are adaptive in the sense of aiding long-term survivability. But neither should the importance of normal psychology and the operations of the genetically-endowed faculties be neglected in favor of the norm setting function of the expert, since this raises insuperable difficulties of identification, both as to who the expert is, and as to the specific content of his apprehensions. The concern here is that the author hasn't done anything to assuage the “conservative” consequences of Aristotle's elitism. While his examples of virtue—Copernicus, for instance—are well-taken, these are men whose merit is recognized and attributed only retrospectively; in a more synchronic context, it remains easy to see how granting a norm-setting function to the expert is largely to associate such norms not with such paradigm-breaking figures, but rather with orthodoxy, or with those institutions that decide who the experts are.

A similar caution is noted by sociologists of science who worry about traditional epistemology as founded upon an unacknowledged self-privileging, and a 'principle of asymmetry,' in which the truth of a scientist's true beliefs are explained simply by their “good” supporting reasons, while mistaken belief (and only mistaken belief) calls for sociological analysis. Such an explanatory asymmetry, as Barbara Herrnstein Smith points out, “is a general feature of defenses of orthodoxy: political, aesthetic, and scientific as well as philosophical.”1 What Holt accepts as a seminal point of Aristotle's thought, that “failures of inquiry may regularly be explained by the absence of some element of character” (105) invites just this kind of response: that it entails a self-privileging asymmetry in explanation and does so in terms of internal traits which he makes out to be quite opaque to scientific analysis and falsification.

Ultimately, then, while I benefited greatly from this book and think that others will as well, I sense that Lynn Holt's worthy project of constructing a virtue epistemology for contemporary times might have been better served had he started somewhat further back, separating himself at the outset from just these aspects of Aristotle's elitism that lead it so evidently into tension with contemporary philosophic naturalism.


1. Barbara Herrnstein Smith, Belief and Resistance, Harvard University Press (1998), p. 83. To be fair, Holt takes no explicit stance on the naturalism/non-naturalism debate; he also separates himself from certain Aristotelian assumption because of what I take to be a genuine concern with naturalism. For instance, he points out how taking episteme and nous as virtues lessens the appearance of infallibilism in Aristotle's account of science. Similarly he insists on the primacy of practice and the practice-embeddedness of rationality. So my point is that the same concerns that motivate these aspects of Holt's thought should have also led him to challenge the explanatory asymmetry implicit in Aristotle's approach. I do not see a resolution to the tension between the practice embeddedness of reason, and the vision of the autonomous virtuous agent that we find in this text. For an overview of the debate about naturalism focusing on the role of intuition in analytic philosophy, see Gary Gutting, “Rethinking Intuition: A Historical and Metaphilosophical Introduction,” in Michael R. DePaul and William Ramsey (eds.), Rethinking Intuition. Lanham: Rowman & Littlefield, pubs., 1998: 3-13.