Approaching God: Between Phenomenology and Theology

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Patrick Masterson, Approaching God: Between Phenomenology and Theology, Bloomsbury, 2013, 204pp, $29.95 (pbk), ISBN 9781623563080.

Reviewed by Felix Ó Murchadha, National University of Ireland, Galway


Patrick Masterson's new book is a welcome contribution to the debate concerning the meta-phenomenological and meta-theological question of the mode of approach to and from God. Indeed, as he tells us in the first line of the Introduction, the title is deliberately ambiguous between the approach to God and being approached by God. The word 'approach' itself speaks of nearness, of coming near; yet God seems to be, if at all, distant.

The first chapter on Phenomenology concentrates on the work of Jean-Luc Marion. Masterson is clear about the merits of a phenomenological approach as manifest in Marion's account, emphasizing the attentiveness to personal experience, its resistance to any question begging reductionism, openness to religious phenomena, the place of human practice with respect to religious phenomena and its emphasis on faithful description. He goes on, however, to pose fundamental questions that in one form or another are pursued throughout the book. The first objection, as Masterson states it, is that the phenomenological reduction distorts the givens of the natural attitude rather than elucidating them. Independent existing reality is experienced in intuitive perception, and reducing such reality to phenomena ignores that "the phenomena are not the networks of things, but things are the source of phenomena" (21). The second related difficulty is that phenomenology limits the account of the divine to that which is within human experience, while the religious believer's account of divine transcendence involves the claim that God is unbounded by any human experience.

"The independent existence of things seems too weighty a matter to ignore" (31). This issue points for Masterson to the need to go beyond Phenomenology towards other approaches that account for such independent existence and more particularly the transcendence of God, without the restrictions of the phenomenological approach. These are the metaphysical and theological approaches. By metaphysics Masterson understands realist metaphysics, and just as Marion exemplifies phenomenology, Aquinas exemplifies such metaphysics. As Masterson understands it, "metaphysical realism, accepting that a real world exists independently of our representation of it, seeks insofar as is humanly possible to provide an objective impersonal account of it in judgments which strive more or less successfully to conform to it" (34). Masterson pays particular attention here to the analogical concept of being: "one might even speak of a 'metaphysical re-duction' or 'leading back to' the analogical unity of being" (35). His account of Aquinas is clear, informative and illuminating. In particular he shows how Aquinas overcame the limits of Aristotelian hylomorphism. Being for Aquinas is essentially finite, and this is so not due to limitation imposed by other beings, but due to the intrinsic limitations of all beings. All being is composite, and the nature of such composition is that of limited, finite determination. Existence, esse, on the other hands, signifies act not form, which actualizes potency as this being in particular instances. God is pure esse, pure existence, the pure act of being. While essence is correlated to intellect, existence, is not. God is beyond comprehension, because God is beyond being. Act is "the ground . . . of all possibility, of all change, or all perfection" (50). What Aquinas presents are a posteriori proofs of God's existence. The legitimate metaphysical proofs are based on the principle of non-contradiction. Such proofs begin with the seemingly contradictory state of finite beings and show that without affirmation of an explanatory cause beyond finite beings such contradictions cannot be resolved.

The question of the coexistence of God with his creation, the issue namely of the compatibility of human freedom and divine omniscience and omnipotence, is, Masterson claims, one that exercises us today more than the other traditional questions concerning the meaning and existence of God. In addressing this question Masterson again stresses the Thomistic emphasis on existence. What is distinct about creation as a form of causality is "that it is an absolute supra-temporal origination of finite existence, esse, and not a temporal process" (62). Masterson emphasizes that such an account marks a clear break with the Aristotelian account of God as final cause, and that despite the claims by "some phenomenologists" to the contrary, Aquinas is not reproducing Aristotle with God as the supreme being. In other words, Aquinas is not an onto-theologian (67).

Masterson then turns to theology and specifically to Karl Barth and (again) Aquinas. Understanding theology as the "culturally conditioned, engagement of human reason in the effort to achieve a faithful developed understanding of the true account of everything as disclosed by Revelation" (70), he points to the central claim of Christian revelation, which transcends any possible metaphysical claim, "that we are loved by God" (70). All of this is premised on the faith of the believer, both subjectively and objectively understood. He then draws the contrast between two opposed ways of understanding this endeavor, that of Barth and of Aquinas. The fundamental difference here is the role of natural theology and the power of human reason. Barth denies the role of reason and natural theology in any fruitful understanding of the Christian God and has little sympathy for a metaphysical approach. For Aquinas, on the other hand, human intellect prepares the ground for divine revelation and the truths revealed in revelation cannot contradict those known to natural reason. Masterson is clear regarding the source of a fundamental difference here, namely with respect to original sin: it is "Aquinas' conviction that original sin did not entail the corruption of human nature, including natural reason." He notes further that this differs markedly from Luther, "Barth's forerunner and inspiration" (78).

The remainder of the book attempts to weave together the three approaches already outlined. Masterson begins this process by considering the most ambitious attempt to do this, namely that of Hegel. This attempt fails, for Masterson, above all because it falsifies the religious belief for which it is supposed to account. He argues that Hegel transformed three fundamental ideas about God in monotheism: the absolute freedom of God with respect to creation, God's unqualified transcendence to finite beings and the eternal immutability of God's perfection. In each case Hegel ends up reconceptualizing God in relation to spirit and distorting the theological and metaphysical accounts of God in the process. This is a judgment not unique to Masterson, but does not go uncontested among Hegel scholars. Masterson does not discuss this debate in any detail. The chapter functions more to place his later discussions as in part responses to the failures (as he sees it) of the Hegelian solution.

Placing his discussion in a post-Hegelian situation, and as one that refuses the Hegelian way, Masterson attempts to negotiate the three approaches to God, firstly in strictly philosophical terms and then in a theological respect. For Masterson the strength of phenomenology, that it concentrates on religious experience and avoids an abstract, impersonal notion of God, is also its weakness: the phenomenological reduction fails to give full weight to the transcendence of God and the "move to an affirmation of trans-phenomenal actual existence requires a gear shift from phenomenology to theology" (117). The phenomenological bracketing of existence makes the affirmation of the in se existence of God impossible (118). But is this not to misconstrue the phenomenological reduction? Husserl himself speaks of the 'cancelling' of bracketing, and Marion's radicalization of the reduction aims precisely to orientate thought toward transcendence. The phenomenologist does not deny the in-itself, but seeks rather to let the in-itself show itself. In that sense, it is not clear that there is any "commitment to the phenomenological principle of immanence" (119); rather phenomenology traces transcendence in immanence. Understood in this way, the fact that transcendence does not disclose itself directly to experience is not a denial of its objective reality, but in fact the affirmation of that reality as in excess of anything which can be immanent to consciousness. Phenomenologically there can be no correlation of God and self. This lies at the roots of the notion of the 'trace' in Levinas, an account that Masterson never thematizes. Instead, Masterson argues that phenomenology needs to be reciprocally complemented by metaphysics.

As Masterson sees it, Marion shares with metaphysical realism a rejection of idealism and, despite Marion's rejection of metaphysical realism as epistemologically naive, Masterson claims that the phenomenological approach contains implications that cannot be accounted for purely phenomenologically. In short, "the objective ontological affirmations of metaphysics provide the theoretical truth conditions of what is described and asserted phenomenologically as given to conscious subjectivity" (129). While phenomenology offers indications of the possibility of a transcendent God of love and goodness, it cannot account for the actual reality of such a God. Metaphysical accounts that employ "indirect causal argument" are necessary to do this. I am unconvinced that this complementarity can consistently be recognized as such either by a phenomenologist or a metaphysician: the metaphysician can only view as irrelevant if not misleading the attempt to bracket existence, while the phenomenologist cannot accept the metaphysician's claim to existence independent of phenomenological description. In that case Masterson's project can only function from a third place, a philosophical position that is neither phenomenological nor metaphysical, but relates to both from a reflective distance. Masterson hints in places that this position is that of fides quaerens intellectum, where phenomenology and metaphysics can be employed without commitment to either guided by a more fundamental existential commitment to approach an approaching God.

Finally, Masterson turns to theology and argues that while metaphysics provides theology with an appropriate tool for an account of the natural condition as creatures, phenomenology is more appropriate to discussing the divinization into God's life. Creation he understands as the "the action of originating the universe absolutely" (140). It should be noted that this is a specific account of creation, as creatio ex nihilo, arguably an account which is not supported by the first lines of Genesis and arises from specifically Christian concerns. Metaphysics can give an account of divine causality on the basis of an account of finite entities, which is closed to phenomenology, according to Masterson. With respect to divinization, he discusses grace in terms of Marion's saturated phenomenon and shows how phenomenology can account for a "self-involving faith experience of the immanent presence of God as loving paternal distance" (156). Remarkably, although the earlier chapter on theology discusses the work of Barth, the Swiss theologian is not discussed in this final chapter. The earlier discussion of Barth was itself brief and failed to acknowledge the development in Barth's position between his groundbreaking Epistle to the Romans and his later Church Dogmatics. Following that brief discussion Barth plays no further role in this book, and as a consequence the three way discussion (between Marion, Aquinas and Barth) becomes a two way dialogue between Marion and Aquinas, under the triple aspects of phenomenology, metaphysics and theology. This is unfortunate as Barth would clearly form a stronger contrast to metaphysics than Aquinas, while arguably the 'theological turn' in phenomenology has strong Barthian elements. As Masterson himself notes Marion orientates himself to a Barthian rather than neo-Thomist theology (173). The place of Augustine in the background to these discussions could also be noted, particularly in the light of Marion's recent work on Augustine.

Despite these reservations, there is no doubt that this is an important contribution to an ongoing debate. For Masterson there are no tidy answers to the question of the relation of phenomenology, metaphysics and theology. The intersection of these three approaches needs to be continuously negotiated. Masterson sees himself as setting out a "roadmap" for a "complex landscape" (159), and he has certainly done this. To even find oneself in this landscape it is necessary to first take seriously the approach of God or at least its possibility. That initial existential situatedness is one in which and for which these approaches are paths in a territory in which human finitude faces the infinite.