Aquinas and the Nicomachean Ethics

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Tobias Hoffmann, Jörn Müller, and Matthias Perkams (eds.), Aquinas and the Nicomachean Ethics, Cambridge University Press, 2013, 275pp., $95.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781107002678.

Reviewed by Andrew Pinsent, University of Oxford


The choice of topic and the excellence of the contributors promise a great deal from this edited volume. The Nicomachean Ethics (EN) has been described as the 'canonical text' of the dominant tradition of virtue ethics, and much of what is published today makes extensive references to the work of Aristotle either as a foundation or a foil.[1] With a parallel resurgence of interest in the vast and influential works of Thomas Aquinas, the rationale is clear for a new examination of how Aquinas interpreted and adapted the work of Aristotle, especially in regard to the virtues and human action. The group assembled here includes some outstanding scholars who write with commendable clarity. As a consequence, even readers who have studied Aquinas in detail are likely to benefit from new insights. For understanding the key principles of Aquinas's use of the EN, however, the volume does not wholly live up to the expectations of its title. I judge therefore that the definitive work on these matters for the early twenty-first century remains to be written.

The volume begins with a brief review of the key questions and state of scholarship. A focus of much historical work has been Aquinas's famous commentary on the EN, the Sententia libri Ethicorum (SLE), but Aquinas also devoted roughly one-third of his greatest systematic work on theology, the Summa Theologiae (ST), to virtue ethics, much of which also draws from the EN. Hence a primary question of interpretation, listed as point 4 in the introduction (8) is, "How does his [Aquinas's] treatment of the EN in the SLE differ from his treatment of the EN in his systematic theological writings? What accounts for these differences?" A secondary and associated question concerns the purpose, accuracy and utility of the 'non-theological' SLE, and whether Aquinas's commentary properly expresses an autonomous philosophical ethics or includes crypto-theological elements, as Harry Jaffa claimed.[2] A third group of questions concerns the comparison of key principles and categories, such as Aquinas's treatment of the will, the cardinal virtues, and details of particular virtues. Although the SLE and ST are the principal sources for addressing these questions, other materials include the disputed questions, commentaries on other works, including scripture, and previous commentaries on Aristotle, especially the work of Aquinas's teacher, Albert the Great.

The complexity of the issues covered, and the nuanced approach of many of the contributors make generalizations difficult, as the editors acknowledge (9), but certain themes emerge quickly. For example, an important early chapter by Terence Irwin responds to an objection that has often been levelled at the SLE, namely that it is not a historical text but mixes in extraneous material, especially from theology. Having argued that a commentary can legitimately employ terms, make connections, and address problems that are not in an original text, Irwin presents three key instances in which Aquinas does indeed make some use of extraneous considerations but, in doing so, gets Aristotle right or comes close to doing so. Irwin also presents an interesting instance of Aquinas avoiding such considerations and, in doing so, getting Aristotle wrong. Hence he argues that Aquinas's limited use of extraneous material does not, in itself, invalidate the use of the SLE even if the goal is simply historical accuracy in understanding Aristotle's intentions and achievements.

A further key issue identified in Irwin's chapter, and also in the contributions of Perkams, Bonnie Kent, and Martin Pickavé, is Aquinas's treatment of the will, and in particular the interpretation of the will as "a power of the soul, to be distinguished from both the practical intellect and from non-rational inclinations" (11). Rather than a mere 'rational appetite,' which some claim to be implicit in Aristotle's work, Perkams outlines Aquinas's account of the will as enabling 'internal acts' (89). These acts are completed with the acceptance of a course of action proposed by reason and are first and foremost the objects of moral evaluation (90). In addition, Aquinas ascribes to the virtues a less determining role than Aristotle, emphasizing how the will enables a choice that may be at variance from what these dispositions would imply. On this point, Kent (107) draws attention to a saying that often appears in Aquinas's theological works, "A disposition is that whereby one acts when one wills (habitus est quo quis agit cum voluerit)," underlining that there is an 'I' capable of choosing to use dispositions, of choosing not to use them or even acting contrary to them (109). The meaning and priority of the will underlines therefore how Aquinas, although relatively distant from us in time, is nevertheless on the same side of a profound change in the first-person perspective between the work of Aristotle and Augustine.[3]

The remaining chapters address a diverse range of topics: Michael Pakaluk identifies five key questions about the meanings, distinctions and ordering of moral virtues. He claims these questions are not properly addressed by Aristotle but are all answered by Aquinas's account of the cardinal virtues, itself drawn from the application of Aristotelian natural philosophy and metaphysics. On this reading even the accounts of the moral virtues in Aquinas's theological writings, especially ST II-II.47-170, grow out of Aristotle's work, a claim also made later by Kevin Flannery on the virtue of truth-telling specifically (145). Müller carries out a rather complex set of comparisons between perfect and imperfect beatitude within and between the works of Aristotle, Albert and Aquinas, suggesting that Aquinas adopted an 'intellectualist' characteristic of happiness from Aristotle but in what is overall an "inclusivist" interpretation of the EN (70), i.e., a perfect life that depends on a complete set of virtues, completed by other intrinsically valuable goods (54). Jennifer Herdt examines in detail the virtue of courage in Aristotle, Albert and Aquinas, interpreting the SLE as developing the EN, often with principles drawn from Aristotle, in such a way as to prepare the ground for the fuller account of courage in the ST.

On the subject of justice, Jeffrey Hause argues along similar lines that Aquinas in the SLE restricts himself to filling in lacunae by appeal to Aristotle's own philosophical project, leading to an account of natural justice that is more defensible on its own terms and which is also capable of inclusion within a transformed theological system (164). Hoffmann draws attention to the way that prudence for Aquinas depends not only on the moral virtues, but also on an understanding of universal practical principles, a dependence that is not made (or at least not made explicit) by Aristotle. Marko Fuchs examines some of the ways in which Aquinas, on account of his theological principles, modifies the Aristotelian account of friendship. Kevin White examines Aristotle's account of pleasure perfecting action as a supervening end, with Aquinas's qualification (234-236, cf. SLE 10.6 line 76) that this supervenience is in the manner of a form that completes beatitude, and the further Augustinian qualification in ST that pleasure perfects in the manner of an end that is a repose of appetite (236-237, cf. ST I-II.33.4). A final chapter by Candace Vogler warns against some contemporary efforts to pursue the study of virtues in isolation from the broader ethical framework of Aristotle and Aquinas, notably the moral evaluation of acts as good or bad and, in particular, the issue of moral prohibition (249, 257).

With a few exceptions, the majority of these chapters provide helpful clarifications and insights into the matters that their authors choose to address. Nevertheless, the sapiential value of the volume as a whole falls short of expectations, its cognitive impact resembling searchlights that illuminate a few patches of ground brilliantly while the broader landscape remains shrouded in darkness. For example, by far the largest portion of Aquinas's work on the virtues is to be found in his theological writings, with the one thousand and four articles of ST I-II.55-70 and II-II.1-170 arguably constituting the largest and most complex systematic account of virtue ethics ever attempted. Nevertheless, the treatment of the relevant theological writings in this volume is fragmentary, lacks a systematic account of Aquinas's approach as a whole, and is dubious in places.

Consider, for instance, the claim (142) that there is little doubt that when Aquinas speaks about the virtue of truth in the ST I-II.109-113, he regards himself as speaking of the same virtue of truth as found in EN 4.7. This claim is plausible on the basis of a small set of articles and is well argued on points of detail. The broader context, however, is that the virtue of truth is the sixth of nine virtues that Aquinas connects to justice as "quasi-potential parts" of justice (ST I-II.80-120), the fifth of seven major virtues of ST II-II.1-170. Three of these seven virtues, faith, hope and love (ST II-II.1-46), have no Aristotelian counterparts, and the accounts of the others, including justice, include many non-Aristotelian topics and describe characteristics that are different in kind from their counterparts in the EN. Even for the virtue of truth specifically, three of the ten articles of ST II-II.100-113 are about whether, and to what extent, the actions of vices opposed to truth are 'mortal sins.' As a singular action, this category of wrongdoing 'cuts off' what Aquinas calls the perfect "infused virtues" (cf. ST 1 -- 2.65.2), but not dispositions acquired by habituation in the Aristotelian manner (ST I-II.71.4). The broader context therefore raises the question of what Aquinas means when he refers to the "'virtue of truth' in ST I-II.109-113, a question that can also be raised in regard to practically any virtue of ST II-II.1-170. In the vast majority of cases in which Aquinas provides no explicit qualification, are these articles intended to describe virtues that Aquinas calls 'infused' (ST I-II.55.4) or those that can be acquired in the Aristotelian manner? If these virtues are 'infused', how do they differ from their homonymous counterparts in the EN? Such questions are of the greatest importance to any attempt to interpret Aquinas's theological writings in relation to the EN. Unfortunately, however, even the few references to the infused moral virtues (e.g., 121, 161) do not address directly the question of the species of virtue in those many cases that lack explicit qualification. The chapter that considers the cardinal virtues in ST II- II and the meaning of the term 'virtue,' does not even raise the issue of the infused virtues, and the volume as a whole omits any systematic examination of the controversies surrounding the relation of the infused virtues and their acquired homonymous counterparts generally.

Along with these remarkable omissions, the volume also neglects to highlight or examine another profound difference between the approach of the theological writings and the EN. Aquinas embeds his account of the infused virtues within a fourfold system of perfective attributes that comprises two dispositions, the virtues and the gifts, and two actualizations, the beatitudes and the fruits (the 'VGBF' structure). The latter three attributes, inspired by Aquinas's theological tradition, lack any Aristotelian counterparts, but they are integral to the superstructure of ST I-II.55-70 and II- II.1 -- 170.[4] Moreover, the gifts are rated by Aquinas as more crucial to what he considers as true human flourishing than any of the dispositions mentioned in the EN, or even their infused counterparts (ST I-II.68.8). Yet the entire volume makes no mention of the VGBF structure, only occasionally references the gifts (e.g., 117, 121, 178) and fails to address their peculiar mode of operation, namely that they are dispositions by which a person is 'moved' by a personal God with respect to some object (ST I -II.68.1). This triadic person-person-object scenario in which one appropriates the stance of the other person, in a union of soul with the other person, may have parallels with everyday phenomena of social cognition such as 'joint attention.'[5]

At any rate, the operation of the gifts offers a radically different approach to some of the matters addressed here. Consider, for instance, the claim made by Fuchs that Aquinas transforms the Aristotelian theory of friendship because of his theological commitments. Fuchs interprets this transformation to mean that "we do not love him [our neighbour] because of him- or herself, but because of God" (218). On this reading, all love of anyone and anything apart from God is extrinsic to what is loved, violating the common sense of what we mean by 'love'. The triadic operation of the gifts, appended to the infused virtues, provides an alternative reading, namely being moved non-coercively by God to love with God those whom God loves. By this understanding, Aquinas's theological commitments do not imply that we do not love our neighbour because of him- or herself, but rather that the quality of this love is changed by the perceived relation to God. In the perfect actualization of the 'fruit of benignity,' Aquinas describes this love by the metaphor of a salutary flame of love enkindling the desire to be kind to one's neighbour (ST I-II.70.3). The sense of this description is different from what seems to me a rather cold and detached interpretation in which, for example, I love you only because of someone who is not you.

The comparative neglect of the theological virtues, the infused moral virtues, the gifts, and the VGBF structure in this volume draws attention to the broader challenge of how to understand the relationship of Aquinas to the EN in future. I offer two suggestions. First, although wide and deep expertise is required, a relatively slim edited volume of this kind is probably not the best way to proceed, especially as it lacks even a subject index. Such volumes often explore interesting points of detail but usually lack sufficient systematic order, a defect that is especially serious when relating the works of two such extraordinarily ordered thinkers as Aristotle and Aquinas. Second, the unparalleled influence of the EN on the history of virtue ethics risks introducing cognitive bias, filtering out of consideration the many elements of Aquinas's account of the virtues and human action that cannot easily be understood by reference to the EN. These non-Aristotelian elements become in effect surrounded by what the late, great Douglas Adams called a 'Somebody Else's Problem field,' rendering them opaque to ordinary perception.[6] The attempt to interpret the residue from an Aristotelian perspective is then like trying to understand the solar system from an Aristotelian perspective. No matter how many epicycles are added, the larger picture remains obscure and distorted. I would therefore reverse the typical order of examination and start with the theological works rather than the SLE. These works describe the ultimate goal to which Aquinas's writings on the virtues are ordered, and although their specifically theological character might appear to limit their philosophical appeal, it is not difficult to find parallels in interpersonal (or arguably second-personal) flourishing in daily life. At any rate, if we begin by examining what Aquinas regards as true human flourishing as a whole and on its own terms, we may then be in a more promising position to understand his appropriation of the EN in general, including in his commentary.

[1] The assessment of EN as a 'canonical text' can be found in Alasdair MacIntyre, After Virtue: A Study in Moral Theory, 3rd Edition (Notre Dame, Ind.: University of Notre Dame Press, 2007), 147.

[2] Harry V. Jaffa, Thomism and Aristotelianism: A Study of the Commentary by Thomas Aquinas on the Nicomachean Ethics (Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 1952).

[3] An emphatically self-aware first-person perspective is associated especially with Augustine, arguably expressed most clearly in the context of a perceived relationship to God as 'you,' in other words a relationship to God that is second-personal (as expressed, for example, in the famous passage of Confessions 10.27.38). I would suggest, however, that once articulated, it becomes natural to attribute certain faculties closely associated with a vivid first-person perspective, notably the will, even to those such as Aristotle who would not attribute such faculties to themselves. In the case of the SLE, such attributions do not in themselves mean that Aquinas should not be taken seriously as a historically accurate interpreter, a point to which Irwin draws attention (28-29).

[4] As one example, the prologue to Aquinas's treatment of the virtues identifies clearly the interconnection of these fourfold attributes in his account of what he considers to be true human flourishing, ST I-II.55, pr. "We must speak in the first place of the good dispositions, which are virtues, and of other matters connected with them, namely the gifts, beatitudes and fruits."

[5] I have argued for an interpretation of the gifts in terms of 'joint attention' in chapter two of Andrew Pinsent, The Second-Person Perspective in Aquinas's Ethics: Virtues and Gifts(New York; Abingdon, UK: Routledge, 2012). On this reading, the gifts and infused virtues help remove an innate 'spiritual autism,' enabling a second-person relatedness to God that culminates in friendship. Due to this relatedness, even apparently familiar virtues, such as justice, are different in kind from their counterparts in the EN.

[6] Douglas Adams, Life, the Universe, and Everything (London: Pan, 1982), chap. 3.