Aquinas on Beauty

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Christopher Scott Sevier, Aquinas on Beauty, Lexington Books, 2015, 226pp., $85.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780739184240.


Reviewed by Robert E. Wood, University of Dallas


Christopher Sevier begins by noting the recent rise in the interest in beauty and the little that has been done book-length, especially in the last twenty years, to consider Aquinas' thoughts on beauty. Hence, the current volume.

The book's Introduction and Conclusion flank four central chapters (2-5). It is not until chapter four that Sevier treats the central topic of the book: objective components of beauty. The endnotes and bibliography are quite ample. In fact, of the book's 226 pages, 79 are devoted to notes and 23 to bibliography. The ground has indeed often been plowed. Those interested in the topics of the six chapters will find many directions for research in the notes, the chief value of the current text. Sevier includes not only work on Aquinas, but also occasionally mentions the work of other thinkers who have dealt with the topics in question.

In his Introduction Sevier notes the paucity of texts in Aquinas dealing with sensory beauty and the more ample focus, through commentary on Dionysius, upon divine beauty. The latter appears in the fifth chapter. People dealing with aesthetics today are more focused on sensory-based beauty and, like Kant, find any other usage metaphorical. They will find little to appreciate on sensory beauty in this book. Sevier notes the few things Aquinas has said about beauty, especially the definition as "that which, when seen, pleases" and the properties of "integrity, proportion, and clarity." He works hard to expand on these few elements in his fourth chapter.

Sevier approaches the topics devoted to Aquinas' psychology in chapters 2 and 3 ("Psychological Components of Beauty" and "Human Desire and Pleasure"). The second chapter, on human psychology, begins with a quotation from Aquinas on goodness and beauty. Both are related to form: the good to appetite, the beautiful to cognition. (13) Sevier notes a tension in Aquinas' thought regarding beauty as formal cause and as final cause, the latter of which it shares with goodness. (15) He cites the aforementioned definition of beauty ("that which, when seen, pleases") and links it to the grounds Aquinas provides in both the seen thing and the seeing by reason of each being a kind of proportion. (17) He will treat that notion several times.

Aesthetic perception is possible because of the presence of both intellect and visual capacity, and, as in Kant, presents a distinctively human operation not shared by either animals or angels. The human intellect, following Aristotle, is essentially and not accidentally incarnate. Intellectual activity always has its roots in organized sensory experience expressed in "phantasms" or modes of appearance developed over time in the perceiver. Because of this, "man alone takes pleasure in the beauty of sensible objects for its own sake." (26)

The third chapter, "Human Desire and Pleasure," is the most extensive. Sevier notes that Aquinas distinguishes desire and appetite and then goes on to say that he uses appetitus for both desiderium that is the movement toward the object and amor, which initiates action. Pleasure arises as a byproduct. There is both sensory and intellectual appetitus, with the former divided into concupiscible and irascible. (41-42) (Aquinas here, as in most of his psychology, is following Aristotle.)

What gives a person pleasure is an indication of the kind of being one is. (44) Aesthetic pleasure arises from the perception of beauty, which consists, Aquinas says, "in a certain clarity (claritate) and due proportion (debita proportione)," each of which "is found radically in the reason." (45) Sevier says that Aquinas distinguishes sensory from spiritual pleasure in that the latter is experienced "all at once" since reason apprehends the eternal. (48) As in Aristotle, note that the latter is "actus perfecti" and applies to sensing and life, as well as to reason, and is thus not a distinguishing feature of spiritual pleasure alone. What does distinguish them is that, contrary to the pleasures of the senses, which disappear once the object is obtained, the pleasure of spiritual love increases through the possession of the object. (57) Aquinas cites Aristotle's position that appropriate pleasures increase activity where improper pleasures hinder it: the latter destroy prudence as the ability to direct oneself rationally. The more pleasure in rational activity, the greater the attention to the object. (58-59)

Amor encompasses desire for the absent good and pleasure in the present good. Love applies both to concupiscible and rational desire, the latter of which is termed dilectio and implies a choice. (61)

In an interesting interpolation, Sevier claims that "if we conceive of morality in terms of human flourishing, then cultivating love for (and consequent pleasure in) beauty is a moral imperative." (52) I wonder if Aquinas would agree, but it is a suggestive comment.

Aquinas assesses traditional notions of pleasure: the Stoic view that all pleasures are evil, the Epicurean that all pleasures are good, the Platonic that some are good, some are bad. (64-66) Aquinas assigns a distinctive pleasure to the will as measure of good and bad. (66-67) Following Aristotle as usual, Aquinas distinguishes goods as useful, pleasant, and honestum. Sevier renders the latter as "fine (or beautiful)." (70) Only the honestum is an end in itself. He will consider that more extensively in the fifth chapter.

Sevier returns to the notion of proportion between the thing and the faculty. He regards it as "the recognition of the intrinsic goodness or the degree of perfection of that object compared to its ideal or archetype, and cognized under the aspect of the visible." (71) Also, "under the aspect of the visible" plays in relation to "id quod visum placet, that which, when seen, pleases." Earlier on the same page Sevier renders the translation more extensively as "that which, when perceived, pleases." The latter is clearly Aquinas' position when he includes hearing as one of the two "most cognitive" senses. As noted in Augustine, "seeing" is a metaphor for all cognitive states. (55; on 115, Sevier cites ST I, 67, 1.) Beauty adds to the good the relation to cognition. (62)

In a section on "Distinterested Pleasure and Desire," the author cites Aquinas on play: it is a dilectio animalis as a rest for the soul, having no other end than its own delight. Like wisdom in Ecclesiasticus, it is sought for its own sake. Aquinas surprisingly places it under modesty, for which Sevier gives no explanation. (74-75) The parallel disinterested character involved in the appreciation of beauty involves an interest of a higher order. (76)

The fourth chapter, the most interesting, focuses upon "Objective Components of Beauty." Beauty requires three things: integritas sive perfectio, debita proportio sive consonantia, and claritas, unde quae habent colorem nitidum. (ST I, 39, 8) Aquinas links them with a consideration of God the Son. (105) This description contains two notions of beauty: the aesthetics of proportion and the aesthetics of light "radiance, splendor, and brilliance," (106, citing Edgar De Bruyne. One wonders if these are the same property with different terms.) The two notions of beauty involved have an ancient pedigree. (103) The aesthetics of proportion goes back to the Pythagoreans and has dominated discussion through the ages. The aesthetics of light has a special place in Plotinus. For him, not all beautiful objects are proportionate, like light and color. He speaks of illumination and links it to the radiance or expression of life. (111-12)

Sevier discusses each of the properties in some detail: proportion or consonance (106-11), clarity (111-16) and integrity or perfection (116-19). Proportion or consonance involves the relation of parts to wholes, as in architecture where it is spoken of as symmetria and in music as harmonia. Both cases involve mathematical relations. Sevier cites Umberto Eco, who distinguishes psychological proportion and ontological proportion. (106) The senses are a kind of proportion in relation to their objects, which are proportionate in themselves. For proportion, Aquinas sometimes uses ratio, which also translates as 'reason.' (107) There is also a proportion of all things to the Creator, allowing one to judge a thing in relation to its ideal. (108) Proportion is in things, in their relation to sensing and intellection, and in all things' relation to their Creator. "Reason" is what allows us to make the proportions manifest.

Aquinas describes claritas as involving colorem nitidum, "bright color." The latter is disappointing: "bright color" suggests the gaudy! That follows the focus upon the visum. What would that mean for music? Sevier suggests that the bright color refers to human complexion -- which seems a stretch. (114) Fortunately there are countervailing texts that suggest something like splendor. "Claritas is the light that makes beauty seen." (112) In discussion of the Word, claritas is "the light and splendor of the intellect." (115) This involves taking creation as divine expression. Sevier admits that "this sense is, unfortunately, only pried with some difficulty from the present text." (116)

Of the three properties, Aquinas mentions integrity or perfection the least. Sevier finds it hard to divorce it from the notion of proportion. (117) Integrity is related to moral perfection as an instance of beauty from which the author suggests Aquinas may have transferred integrity to all forms of beauty. (119)

Sevier then comes back to a discussion of honestum as related to virtutem, docorem, utile, and delectabile. (119-22 -- not exactly parallel in their cases.) He presents an interesting quotation from Aquinas (ST, II-II, 145, 2) that is worth reproducing: "Spiritual beauty consists in a man's conduct or actions being well proportioned in respect of the spiritual clarity of reason. Now this is what is meant by honestum." (120)

A perennial question is the inclusion of beauty as a transcendental. (123-27) Beauty so considered was alive during Aquinas' lifetime. It was so-called for the first time by Alexander of Hales in 1245; it was so noted by Aquinas' teacher, Albertus Magnus, in his commentary on Dionysius; Bonaventure claimed it involved the fusion of the transcendentals. In Aquinas Sevier suggests that it could be considered "a supernumerary transcendental qualifying the secondary transcendental Good in some way." (125) Jan Aertsen is one of the strongest opponents of this extension, since Aquinas did not expressly name it as such and because he did not indicate its convertibility with Being, only with the Good. (126) In spite of learning toward the transcendental extension, Sevier admits that Aertsen has not yet been answered adequately.

The fifth chapter, "Comparison with Significant Influences," focuses upon Albert and upon Dionysius's De Divinis Nominibus. Sevier wonders how Aquinas can accept the authority of a text whose neoplatonic underpinnings are directly opposed to his own Aristotelian metaphysics, in particular the claim that God is "beyond being." (148) This means that all things as participating in the divine as well as the divine are knowable in certain ways but unknowable in their actual natures. (149)

Calling Aquinas an Aristotelian is only half true. It is certainly true at the level of his treatment of nature, but when it comes to God he is better described as a neoplatonist. Sevier notes that Aquinas cites Dionysius over 1700 times in his literary corpus (158); that would suggest that he is not simply an Aristotelian.

It is from Dionysius that Aquinas draws his notion on the convertibility of the Good and the Beautiful, a position traceable back to Plato. (151) Dionysius links harmony and splendor as chief characteristics of Beauty. (153) Beauty, he says, is the cause of harmony, sympathy, and community between things as their Source. (154) Dionysius follows the Platonic, and indeed the Johannine view, that God is "unapproachable light." (156)

Albert's De Pulchro et Bono has been considered a work of Aquinas, since it is in his handwriting; however, it was actually his transcription of his master's thought. (158) From this work is derived the expression splendor formae so often used in the discussion of Aquinas' aesthetics. (In a typical Scholastic piece, one is surprised by the piling up of terms to describe the surplus of beauty over goodness as a light, a shining, a radiance, a splendor, an incandescence, a resplendence, a lightning (fulgor), a super-fulgence, a claritas [here linked to clarus which means "famous," parallel to Greek doxa as "glory"], a super-splendence rooted in the substantial form.)

Aquinas commented on Dionysius' thought with Albert's commentary on hand. According to Sevier, Aquinas' tendency to compress his master's thought when assimilating it results in a loss of some of the subtlety of Albert's thought. (162) It was through Albert that, Sevier says, Aquinas came to share a neoplatonic view of goodness and beauty. (167)

In his Conclusion, Sevier explains that his interest in ethics and his resistance to the common tendency to subjectivise aesthetic experience led to this work. Aquinas puts together the claim to the objectivity of beauty and the role of subjectivity in experiencing it, both in terms of perception and in terms of the distinctive "disinterested" pleasure it occasions. (182) He notes "the tight connection" in Aquinas's thought between psychology, ethics, and aesthetics. (183) He underscores the link between virtue, beauty, and pleasure. The fully virtuous person is one who take delight in doing the good and irradiates beauty which, when seen, also pleases. (185)

Sevier adds a section on some problems with Aquinas' aesthetics. (187-93) He considers two: the problem of objective measurement and the problem of marginalization of "certain groups already vulnerable to alienation," seemingly those without a comely body. (186) The first concerns both sensory and moral evaluation, and would seem to depend upon worldview. Aquinas' is acceptable to Catholics, but not so evident to others. (187) The second easily involves the distinction between moral and physical beauty. Everything depends upon attending under the right aspect: with beautiful actions under the aspect of virtue; with beautiful bodies under a dual aspect, the right proportion of parts and the correspondence with what he calls "the aspect of its ideal . . . its proportion to its perfect exemplar." (190) One can approach a beautiful object "as a vehicle of self-absorbed hedonism" or as a sign of God's greatness. (191)

There are a few infelicities. 1) The Latin equivalents for power, Sevier says, are potentia, virtus and vir. (22) Vir means 'man.' Though there might be an etymological link, it is not equivalent to the other two terms. 2) He claims, puzzlingly, without grounding in the text or explanation, that the intelligible form is "often stored in the imagination." (25) 3) Instead of the nominative singular of Latin words, he most often uses the word as it is inflected in the sentence involved. However, he notes that pulchritudo is used for decorum, and is qualified by spiritualis or intelligibilem (sic). (119) Earlier he cites "whether delight (delectatio) differs from joy (gaudio)." (45) 4) Oddly, he speaks of pleasure as a passion. (63) 5) Again, he says: "The genus of Being" may be divided into Aristotle's Categories. (124) Not true: Aristotle expressly says that Being is not a genus because it includes all that from which the categories abstract.

But these are only a few minor faults in a work faithful to the mind of Aquinas and well-versed in his texts.