Aquinas on Being

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Kenny, Anthony, Aquinas on Being, Oxford, 2002, 200pp, $45.00 (hbk), ISBN 0198238479.

Reviewed by Robert Pasnau, University of Colorado


When, in 1980, Anthony Kenny published his brief introduction to Aquinas in the Past Masters series (OUP), it created something of a stir. First, he praised in quite strong terms a part of Aquinas’s work that had often been thought obsolete, his philosophy of mind. Then, he attacked Aquinas’s theory of being – widely regarded as the highpoint of his philosophical achievement – as giving rise to “sophistry and illusion” (60). In 1993, Kenny tried to make good on the first of those claims with a more lengthy monograph entitled Aquinas on Mind (Routledge). Now Kenny has taken up the challenge of defending the second claim, in a fairly short book devoted to showing that on the subject of being Aquinas “was thoroughly confused” (v).

These charges are hard to ignore. It is arguable that Kenny is the best philosopher to have engaged seriously with Aquinas since the much earlier work of Peter Geach. Moreover, Kenny is unrivaled in his ability to place Aquinas within the larger context of philosophy as a whole, having devoted himself to the whole history of philosophy, including important studies of Aristotle, Descartes, and Wittgenstein (among much else). Finally, Kenny is among the most clear-headed and engaging champions of Aquinas’s philosophy. For him to attack Aquinas on being is an important event in the field.

Even so, the project is a peculiar one. First, although Kenny reasonably suggests that one can learn as much from historical failures as historical successes (x), one might well urge that the raison d’être of philosophical history is to put on display the insights of past generations. Where dead philosophers have made mistakes, these are best ignored and forgotten. The job of a philosophical historian, then, is to call attention to the good in neglected or obscure works of old; although we should try to learn from the dead, and benefit from their failures, they need not be refuted.

In the present case, admittedly, there may be special reason to violate this principle. No part of Aquinas’s thought has excited as much admiration, in modern times, as his philosophy of being, and so Kenny may be thought of as Locke up against the twentieth-century Thomists, an under-laborer clearing the ground a little, removing some of the rubbish that obscures Aquinas’s real accomplishments. This, however, leads to a second worry about the current project. Kenny begins by declaring that “the subject of Being is one of the most important of all philosophical concerns” (v), anointing his topic from the start with the seriousness of capitalization. But though many philosophers seem to be persuaded that this is so, I myself have the suspicion that being (lowercase) is one of our thinnest and least interesting concepts. Accordingly, when Aquinas announces at the start of On Being and Essence that being is among “the first things grasped by intellect,” my own inclination is to applaud. Yes, of course it is, because although the concept is absolutely global in application, it also lacks richness and complexity. Kenny, in contrast, since he takes our concept of being to be “abstruse and sophisticated” (1), cannot help but see Aquinas’s doctrine as entirely implausible (2). The worry, then, is that our concept of being is hardly rich enough to have become “thoroughly confused.”

As it happens, neither of these worries quite materializes. With respect to the first, although Kenny sets out as if the chapters that follow will be devoted to a single-minded attack on one narrow topic, the book is in fact remarkably wide ranging. Among the many good things it contains are a clear and extended exposition of On Being and Essence, an incisive analysis of Aquinas’s treatment of the ontological argument, and an interesting proposal for how to understand one of Aquinas’s cosmological arguments. So although Kenny makes a great many discouraging remarks about Aquinas on being, those passages are leavened by a great many useful and insightful discussions of some of (what Kenny regards as) the better things in Aquinas.

With respect to the second of the above worries, it turns out to be at least somewhat misleading to describe the focus of Kenny’s criticisms as “Aquinas on Being.” What becomes abundantly clear, as Kenny proceeds, is that Aquinas does not really have a theory of being. What he has are two Latin words (’ens’ [a participle for ’being’] and ’esse’ [for ’to be,’ though used much more widely than our infinitive]), some scattered and brief remarks about the different meanings of these two words, and a number of sometimes obscure metaphysical theses that get formulated in terms of these words. Kenny’s primary interest is in these theses, and his principal claim turns out to be that when we try to get clear on what ’ens’ and ’esse’ mean in the context of these, the theses themselves turn out to be nonsense. (Hereafter, I will follow Kenny’s practice of leaving ’esse’ untranslated.)

Kenny’s preface reports that “there are no fewer than twelve different ways” in which Aquinas uses ’esse’ (ix). The list is supplied in the final chapter: specific existence (e.g., there are bears); individual existence; substantial being; accidental being; common being; actual being; absolute (divine) being; intentional being; fictional being; possible being; predicational being (’is’ as copula); identical being (’is’ of identity). Even without going into the details, it is clear on the whole that there is nothing embarrassing about Aquinas’s recognizing so many kinds of being. These are distinctions that he routinely makes explicit and that it seems perfectly plausible to insist upon. As it turns out, Kenny himself is not concerned about the list per se. His conclusion is instead this: “Aquinas, I submit, failed to bring into a consistent whole the insights he displayed in identifying these different types of being and different senses of ’esse’“ (192). So the fact that there are these twelve senses of being at work is not a bad thing; on the contrary, it displays some insight. The problem is that the list is not brought under systematic control.

Kenny immediately goes on to list the “three principal defects”:

First, there is no satisfactory recognition of the difference between being and existence … . [T]here is at no stage of Aquinas’ career a clear awareness of the profound syntactic difference between the ’there is’ of specific existence and the other types of ’is’ he discusses.
Secondly, the theory that there are spiritual substances that are pure forms or essences involves a celestial Platonism of a kind that Aquinas rightly rejects at the sublunar level … .
Thirdly, there is a deeply disturbing problem about Aquinas’ identification of God with subsistent being … (192-93).

The last alleged defect concerns two claims in Aquinas to which Kenny gives sustained attention:

(1) God’s essence is nothing other than his esse.
(2) God is esse ipsum (pure esse, as Kenny puts it).

(These claims are to be set in contrast to a third claim to which Kenny also gives some attention:

(3) In creatures, esse and essence are distinct.)

Kenny raises many hard questions about these doctrines, and I will not try to summarize them here. It is worth asking, though, whether faults in these doctrines can fairly be regarded as faults in a theory of being. Although Kenny thinks that the difficulties here lie with confusions about being, it is not as if he himself offers a conception of being on which (1) and (2) become newly perspicuous. My own suspicion is that Aquinas is driven to make being something obscure in these contexts because of the mysteries surrounding the divine nature, rather than because of any intrinsic obscurity in his conception of being.

The second alleged defect seems even less to undermine Aquinas’s general conception of being. All the same, it displays another central theme of Kenny’s book, the way Aquinas at certain junctures seems Platonic in ways he should not be, given his general rejection of Platonic realism. In this case, Kenny’s attention is drawn to Aquinas’s repeated comparison of the angels to Platonic Forms – for instance, at Summa theol. 1a 50.2 ad 4, where he compares an angel’s mode of existence to how Whiteness would exist if it were a separated form. There is of course nothing wrong with drawing a comparison to a philosophical theory that one believes false. But Kenny thinks the comparison ought to embarrass Aquinas, because it highlights just what is wrong with his conception of the angels as, in effect, separated forms: “separated substances – angelic spirits and the like – are, as understood by Aquinas, forms that are not forms of anything, and his way of conceiving them seems open to all the objections an Aristotelian would make against a Platonist” (165). This is too quick. Many of Aquinas’s complaints against the Forms make the point that they are ill-suited to an account of the physical world (e.g., Summa theol. 1a 84.1c). So those sorts of difficulties would not apply to a Platonic conception of the angels. More worrisome is Kenny’s observation that separated forms “are not forms of anything.” This is a worry not just about the angels but also about the separated human soul (and potentially about God, inasmuch as God too is described as pure actuality). But it would take some hard work to say exactly what the problem is, and then to canvass possible solutions to the problem.

Kenny is aware of just how hard it is to convict a major philosopher of so sweeping a failure. As he remarks at the start, “in order to defend a text, it is sufficient to find one reading of it which makes it coherent and plausible; if one wishes to expose confusion, one has to explore many possible interpretations before concluding that none makes the text satisfactory” (ix). What Kenny does not say – though he surely must be aware of it – is that the present book falls far short of the patient, thorough effort that would be required to make his negative conclusions stick. Indeed, throughout, Kenny strikes me as all too quick to find confusions where a longer, harder look might see a way out. (In fairness, perhaps this is simply a matter of taste; Kenny has recently criticized my own work for “a tendency to be too charitable … . He perseveres … when it might have been wiser to give up” [TLS March 7, 2003].)

The first of the three defects alleged above – that Aquinas fails to distinguish being and existence – is hard to evaluate. This is the only one of the three that calls directly into question Aquinas’s conception of being. But Kenny does not make it very clear just what the problem is here. There can be no doubt – after reading this book – that Aquinas might have given us a more perspicuous account of his various uses of ’esse.’ The whole situation would be much clearer, however, if Kenny had done more to craft a clear account on Aquinas’s behalf. Because he proceeds in a strictly chronological fashion, we get scattered passages from various works that promise to shed light on Aquinas’s central usages of ’esse.’ As they come, Kenny criticizes them. This procedure – though it will be helpful to anyone interested in a specific text, and though it certainly must have made the book easier to write – strikes me as unfortunate. For instance, it forces Kenny to wait until the very end to discuss the Metaphysics commentary, even though that treatise surely ought to be central to a discussion of Aquinas on being. More generally, it seems to me crucial to read Aquinas’s various treatises in an overlapping manner, as so many rough drafts on the way to a finished product. Although there are occasions where it is reasonable to think Aquinas’s views underwent change, it seems far preferable in general to treat them all together as a single opus from which a single master account of a given subject can be drawn.

If we try, very briefly, to construct this sort of master account for esse, using Kenny’s book as a guide, we might first (drawing on I Sent. 33.1.1 ad 1, III Sent. 6.2.2c, and Quod. IX.2.2c) arrive at a distinction between

Esse1 – a thing’s quiddity or nature;
Esse2 – the actuality of essence (actus essentiae);
Esse3 – the verbal copula signifying the composition of a proposition.

As Kenny suggests (57), esse1 looks to be an outlying usage that we can generally set aside, though we should of course keep it in mind as an interpretive option. (Kenny himself might have been helped by keeping it in mind at various places, as when [174-75] he tries to make sense of Metaph. VIII.2.1694.) As for the second, Quod. IX.2.2c among other passages suggests that we should locate within esse2 the various sorts of being described in the Categories, substantial and accidental. As for the last, Contra gentiles I.12.78 suggests that under esse3 we might want to locate existence in the most familiar and theoretically innocent sense.

This rough scheme promises to consolidate a good many of Kenny’s twelve senses of being. Of course, a great many questions might now be asked. The most obvious question – and perhaps the issue driving Kenny’s first principal defect – is how esse2 (actuality of essence) differs from esse3 (existence). Surely the first thing that needs to be said about this question is that, in ordinary English (even ordinarily philosophical English), the verbs ’to be’ and ’to exist’ are generally used in something like the third sense of esse, to such an extent that it is very hard for us to see what else someone might mean by these words. The second thing to say is that Aquinas, when using ’esse’ as a verbal noun (as he so often does), can generally be assumed to have in mind the second sense. No wonder, then, if we often find Aquinas’s remarks on esse obscure: very often, he is talking about something for which we lack the concept.

But I think that matters are not as dire as that last comment might suggest. Aquinas tells us that esse2 is the actuality of essence. That by itself is no help at all, but he often enough gives helpful examples. Esse is the actuality of being, he says, just as lighting is the actuality of a light (III Sent. 6.2.2c), or living is the actuality of a living thing (I Sent. 33.1.1 ad 1). So the first step toward acquiring the concept of esse2 is to have the concept of actuality: esse2 just is a kind of actuality. Well, what kind? Kenny scarcely addresses this issue at all, focused as he is on the various substantive theses concerning esse. A useful point of departure is a witticism of Ryle’s that Kenny draws on several times (59, 108): that we should not suppose existing is an activity indulged in by everything there is – something like breathing, only quieter. To be sure, this picture would be blatantly wrong for our conception of existence (and blatantly wrong for esse3), but it is only subtly wrong for esse2. It is wrong even there because, first, as Kenny rightly stresses (59), esse2 is not an activity in our sense of the term. It is an Aristotelian first actuality rather than a second actuality (like breathing). This is to say that esse2 should be regarded not as an actual doing of something, but as an actual having the power to do something. Ryle’s image is wrong for a second reason, too. We should not think of esse2 as a generic actuality that everything that exists shares in. Instead, the sort of actuality a thing has depends on the sort of essence it has: the actuality of a human essence is very different from the actuality of a bovine essence, and so the esse2 of a human being and a cow will accordingly be very different.

These remarks should make clear just how alien Aquinas’s conception of esse is, at least in one of its primary senses. No wonder, then, if we have a hard time making sense of the various theses in which we find this concept of esse at work. Whether an account developed along the above lines could render coherent these various theses is a very large question, and Kenny would no doubt find the foregoing sketch entirely inadequate for that purpose. In this short space I mean to suggest only that Aquinas’s various conceptions of being and existence are perhaps not as obscure as they can seem to be – and that we are very far from having to accept Kenny’s ultimate verdict that “it is not possible to extract from his [Aquinas’s] writings a consistent and coherent theory [of being]” (189). Kenny’s book, interesting and important though it is, falls far short of establishing that that is the only possible outcome.

I owe thanks to Chris Shields and Eleonore Stump for their helpful comments on this review.