Aquinas on Efficient Causation and Causal Powers

Frost Aquinas Causation

Gloria Frost, Aquinas on Efficient Causation and Causal Powers, Cambridge University Press, 2022, 239pp., $99.99 (hbk), ISBN 9781009225403.

Reviewed by Can Laurens Löwe, Humboldt University of Berlin


A glass breaks because it is dropped, water boils because it is heated, dough becomes bread because it is baked. For Aquinas, all of these examples involve efficient causation. He develops a sophisticated theory of this type of causation—one in which causal powers take center stage. But there has been as yet no book-length study of this topic. Gloria Frost’s Aquinas on Efficient Causation and Causal Powers fills this gap, and the book is an admirable achievement. Frost sets out, with clarity and exegetical care, Aquinas’s views on what causal powers are, how they are individuated, and how they are exercised in efficient causation. She offers an account of what she terms “paradigm” cases of efficient causation, which involve two causal powers, namely, an active and a passive one. In addition, she examines Aquinas’s theory of “non-paradigm” cases. These include more complex causal processes involving several efficient causes, such as instrumental causation, as well as causal situations that do not involve any causal powers, such as causation through absence.

Chapter 1 introduces salient terminology crucial to understanding Aquinas’s theory of efficient causation. It also contrasts his theory with rival accounts. Frost shows how Aquinas’s account differs from contemporary counterfactual and law-based theories of causation, as well as from Aristotelian accounts defended by later-medieval thinkers like Henry of Ghent and John Buridan.

Chapter 2 examines per se causation, which Frost identifies as the paradigm type of efficient causation in Aquinas. She argues that per se causation involves an agent causing an effect in a patient, where the agent fulfills two requirements. First, the agent must cause the effect in virtue of an active power that it has on account of its nature. Second, it must have an inclination to produce this effect. For example, fire is a per se cause of water’s boiling because fire has, on account of its nature, the active power to heat and an inclination to heat.

Chapter 3 offers a detailed account of the first requirement and zooms in on the notion at its heart, namely, active power. As Frost argues, for Aquinas, all active powers are forms, though not all forms are active powers. In particular, she maintains, active powers are qualities and substantial forms. Frost also investigates in this chapter why “Aquinas thinks that forms are not merely the actuality of matter but also active potentialities” (96). Her novel and compelling answer is that Aquinas views forms as “principles of goodness” (96). The idea is that a form is ordered to an end, namely, to produce like forms in other substances. A form does not, as it were, content itself with actualizing its bearer; it also reaches out into the world and aims to make other things like itself.

The discussion of forms as principles of goodness leads quite naturally to Chapter 4, where Frost examines natural inclination, this being the notion at the heart of the second requirement for per se causation. She argues that a natural agent’s possession of an active power to φ must be distinguished from its natural inclination to φ. On her reading, Aquinas holds that an active power to φ, taken by itself, does not elicit an act of φ-ing in circumstances propitious to its exercise. It merely has the potential to do so. In order for the power to elicit an act of φ-ing, its bearer must also have the natural inclination to φ. Frost describes this inclination as an impetus that “tips the balance” in favor of the power’s φ-ing (126). For example, if fire’s power to burn is in the presence of a flammable object, “the presence of this power in fire does not alone explain why fire actually does burn flammable things [. . . .] Aquinas thinks we must posit something further” (120). This “further” thing is the natural inclination to burn.

Having discussed the role of the agent in per se causation in Chapters 3 and 4, Frost turns in Chapter 5 to the role of the patient. Here Frost discusses the type of power that a patient exercises in efficient causation, namely, passive power. She argues that, at least in the realm of corporeal nature, a substance has a passive power in virtue of its matter—not its prime matter, but rather its proximate matter, which is matter under some form. For example, straw has the power to be burned on account of its matter and its quality of dryness. As Frost shows, form and matter play two distinct roles in accounting for a passive power. A patient’s matter enables it to undergo a change, while its form determines what kind of change it can undergo.

Chapter 6 examines the structure of a per se causal process in Aquinas. As is well known, Aquinas maintains that such a process involves an exercise of an active power—an “action”—and an exercise of a passive power—a “passion.” As is likewise well known, Aquinas claims that action and passion are one and the same actuality. Frost explains how Aquinas motivates this claim, and tackles an interpretative predicament that has beset scholars for quite some time. In some texts, Aquinas says that an action is an actuality in the patient, while in others he tells us that it is an accident in the agent. How can these statements be made consistent? Frost convincingly argues that they can be made consistent once we notice that according to Aquinas “being in” is not a univocal term. On his view, an action is in the patient as an actuality informing the patient, while it is in the agent as an accident arising from it.

Chapters 7 and 8 conclude the book by examining non-paradigm cases of efficient causation. Chapter 7 discusses causes that indirectly contribute to an effect by endowing the agent and the patient with their respective powers to bring about the effect. It also examines Aquinas’s account of the causal salience of absences. In Chapter 8, Frost deals with instrumental and secondary causation in Aquinas. In this context, she also offers a helpful account of Aquinas’s theory of the causal influence of celestial on terrestrial bodies.

Frost’s study contains a number of original and thought-provoking claims, and I find myself in agreement with most of them. However, there are two claims that she makes that seem to me problematic.

The first is that according to Aquinas not only qualities, but also substantial forms are active powers. Frost notes that Aquinas argues in a number of places that a substantial form is not an “immediate principle” of action. Rather, powers that flow from the substantial form are immediate principles. For example, the substantial form of fire is not the immediate principle of heating. Rather, the power to heat, which flows from the substantial form of fire, is. But, as Frost sees it, Aquinas’s views on substantial change imply that he must view a substantial form at least as a kind of remote active power. Take a fire that generates a new fire. For Aquinas, the first fire initially heats some material, such as wood, and this is an accidental change. But once the material has become sufficiently hot, the first fire destroys the wood and produces the second fire. Aquinas thinks that the accidental form of heat alone cannot explain this substantial change. Rather, as he writes in a text from Quaestiones disputatae de anima, q. 12 to which Frost appeals in a note (114, n. 92), “it is required that an accidental form act in virtue of a substantial form, as if it were its instrument. Otherwise, it would not introduce a substantial form through its action” (my translation). Frost thinks that when Aquinas says here that the accidental form acts “in virtue” (in virtute) of a substantial form, he means that the substantial form is a kind of power. To be sure, she holds, it is not an immediate active power to generate because it acts through an accident. But it is a kind of remote active power.

However, this interpretation is problematic. For while there are many passages in which Aquinas says that an accidental form acts “in virtue” of a substantial form in generation, he never says, as far as I know, that a substantial form is a power.[1]

Frost has an additional argument for viewing a substantial form as an active power in Aquinas. As she points out, Aquinas adopts in Summa theologiae I, q. 77, a. 1, c. the principle that “a potentiality must be in the same genus as its act,” and she infers from this that “the production of a new substance demands a potentiality in the genus of substance” (114). I am not sure if this inference goes through. To begin, Aquinas’s principle does not entail that a potentiality must be in the genus of substance if a new substance is an effect of this potentiality. Rather, the principle entails that a potentiality must be in the genus of substance if the act or operation of this potentiality, namely, generating a new substance, is a substance. Now, it is questionable whether Aquinas thinks that a created substance’s operation of generating a new substance is a substance. For he writes in Summa theologiae I, q. 77, a. 1, c. that the “operation of the soul is not in the genus of substance; but only in God, whose operation is his substance” (my translation). Generating another living being is clearly an operation of the soul. In this text the operation of generating another living being is not a substance, in which case the power to generate another living being does not have to be in the genus of substance either, counter to what Frost claims. (The point can be extended, mutatis mutandis, to inanimate substances.) One might worry here that if, as I maintain, the operation of generating a substance is an accident, then it follows that an accident can produce a substance—something that Aquinas surely rejects. But this worry is misplaced. For it isn’t the accident that brings about the substance. Rather, the substance does, but it does so by means of the operation of generating, which is an accident.

This still leaves open the question of how we should understand Aquinas’s claim that an accident brings about a substantial change “in virtue” of a substantial form. I confess that I do not know the answer to this question, but, in view of the above, Frost’s reply that a substantial form is a (remote) active power seems to me at least doubtful.

I now turn to the second claim in Frost’s book that I find problematic. This is the claim that a natural agent’s active power to φ, taken by itself, does not φ in circumstances propitious to its exercise, but requires a natural inclination to φ in order to actually φ. Frost motivates this claim by an analogy that Aquinas draws between natural inclination and the will in Summa theologiae I–II, q. 1, a. 2, c. He writes:

If an agent were not determined toward some effect, it would no more act toward one effect than another. In order that it might produce a determinate effect, it is necessary that an agent be determined toward something certain, which has the nature of an end. Just as this determination happens in rational nature through rational appetite, which is called will, so too in others it happens through natural inclination, which is called natural appetite. (Summa theologiae I–II, q. 1, a. 2, c., Frost’s translation, 120)

In the background of this text is Aquinas’s idea that rational agents have two-way powers. These are powers that are not automatically manifested in the presence of propitious circumstances. Rather, their being manifested depends on the agent’s will. For example, a builder has the power to build, but this power need not be manifested when the builder finds herself in the presence of building materials. Rather, it is up to her whether or not she exercises it. Now, Frost takes Aquinas to say in Summa theologiae I–II, q. 1, a. 2, c. that just as a rational power is by itself not determined to be exercised in suitable circumstances, unless a person wills to exercise it, so a natural power is by itself not determined to be exercised in suitable circumstances, unless a natural inclination determines it to be exercised.

I think the text can be read in the way Frost suggests, but doing so comes at a high price. It requires committing Aquinas to a picture of natural powers that puts them perilously close to rational powers. For, on Frost’s reading, natural powers are by themselves (taken without the element of natural inclination) indeterminate with regard to their exercise. But this indeterminate or two-way nature is, for an Aristotelian like Aquinas, precisely the mark that sets rational powers apart from natural ones. I thus find it doubtful that Aquinas defends the account of natural power that Frost attributes to him.

How, then, should Summa theologiae I–II, q. 1, a. 2, c. be read? I think Aquinas can be taken as saying that unless a natural agent is inclined to a specific effect, it does not have a power to produce this effect at all. Unless fire has a natural inclination to heat, it does not possess the power to heat. In short, the natural inclination to produce some effect is not something added to a power, ensuring that the power gets actualized in suitable circumstances. Rather, it is a constitutive feature of a power: it is the power’s directedness to its specific effect. Without inclination, there is no natural power for a specific effect at all. Admittedly, so understood, the analogy between natural inclination and the will becomes a weaker one. A natural inclination determines what a natural agent does in the sense of bestowing a power for a specific effect upon it. The will, in contrast, determines what a rational agent does not by bestowing a power on the agent. Rather, it determines what the agent does by determining whether or not a power that the rational agent has, such as the power to build, gets exercised. But natural inclination and the will are still similar, on this reading, because they both determine what their respective bearers do. To be sure, they do so differently, but since the text from Summa theologiae I–II, q. 1, a. 2, c. presents an analogy, rather than an identity, between the will and natural inclination, such differences are to be expected.

These two disagreements notwithstanding, I want to emphasize again that Frost’s book is a magnificent achievement. It will greatly benefit scholars working on causation in Aquinas and medieval philosophy more generally. Due to its pellucid style, it also has the potential to be a valuable resource for contemporary metaphysicians who wish to draw on ideas from the Aristotelian tradition to articulate power-based theories of causation.


[1] See, e.g., Commentary on the Sentences II, d. 1, q. 1, a. 4, ad 5; Summa theologiae I, q. 45, a. 8, ad 2; De potentia, q. 3, a. 8, ad 13.