Aquinas on Friendship

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Daniel Schwartz, Aquinas on Friendship, Oxford University Press, 2007, 189pp., $55.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199205394.

Reviewed by Michael Rota, University of St. Thomas (Minnesota)


In Aquinas on Friendship, Daniel Schwartz sets out to "acquaint the reader with some of Aquinas's views on friendship," to critically engage those views, and to "collect along the way those of Aquinas's thoughts that may be helpful in guiding our own reflections on friendship" (vii-viii).

As the author indicates, this book is not a systematic overview of Aquinas's thought on friendship. It is, rather, an extended discussion of Aquinas's views on the extent to which friendship requires conformity of wills between friends, the way in which pride and other vices can endanger friendship, the connections between uncertainty, trust, and hope in friendship, and the relationship between justice and friendship.

The first chapter introduces these larger themes and provides necessary background. Chapter two concerns Aquinas's dictum that the concord between friends is "a union of wills, not of opinions." Aristotle had distinguished three acts of friendship: benevolence, concord, and beneficence. Aquinas takes up this way of thinking about friendship, but, according to Schwartz, has a different view of what concord requires than Aristotle.

In chapter three Schwartz examines the sense in which friendship requires conformity of wills between friends, on Aquinas's view. He does so by considering two possible problems with the claim that friends will the same things, viz. a problem concerning ignorance and a problem concerning disparity of circumstances. The first concerns the fact that "the reasons why the friend wills what he wills are often unknown to us," while the second hinges on the observation that "it is not always appropriate (and sometimes it is morally wrong) for us to will what our friend wills, given that his circumstances may be radically different from ours" (42).

In chapter four, Schwartz examines the ways in which vainglory and unreasonable pride can be impediments to friendship and political life. Here Schwartz is at his best, examining and commenting on Aquinas's views that (a) sometimes one can be unwilling to give up one's own will, precisely because one wants to show that one is not inferior to others, (b) the inordinate desire to stand out can cause one to unduly dismiss others and concentrate only on their faults, (c) pride can be an obstacle to learning from others, and (d) pride can lead to an unwillingness to submit to law and authority.

Because some commonality of wills is required for friendship, uncertainty about what a friend or potential friend wants and desires can be an obstacle to friendship. And the same goes for certain sorts of uncertainty about what a friend will want and desire in the future. In chapter five Schwartz discusses, first, Aquinas's view that we should presume good of others, unless there be evidence to the contrary, and hence that we should presume that people mean what they say, other things being equal and unless there be evidence to the contrary. (Schwartz calls this a "presumption of authenticity".) Second, Schwartz tries to show how hope, for Aquinas, can be an aid to friendship, by being a cause of friendship, by sustaining friendship, and by warding off the "destructive social impact of despair" (122). Schwartz offers the presumption of authenticity as a solution to the problem of uncertainty about others' present wills, and the virtue of hope as a solution to the problem of uncertainty about others' future wills.

In chapter six, Schwartz turns to the connection between justice and friendship. In the Nicomachean Ethics, Aristotle writes that, "When men are friends they have no need of justice" (1155a 26). Schwartz seeks to set Aquinas in opposition to this position, noting that Aquinas is well aware of the presence of conflict within the Church, despite the fact that fellow Christians are (or are supposed to be) bound by bonds of charity (which is a species of friendship). Schwartz also notes Aquinas's position that in certain circumstances it is licit (and can even be good) for Christians to seek legal remedies against each other in court. In the last section of this chapter, Schwartz makes a rather unconvincing argument for the conclusion that, "Aquinas's theological view that there is no merit without (or 'outside') charity can also be expressed non-theologically: when two persons are separated by a wide gap, the actions of the inferior do not lay just claims on the superior unless the inferior is a friend" (140).

On Aquinas's view, sin causes damage to the friendship between a human being and God. Making satisfaction for sin is part of the process of restoring that friendship. In the seventh chapter, Schwartz discusses Aquinas's theological account of satisfaction, with special attention paid to questions about the restoration of human friendship after acts of injustice.

Schwartz's material on pride and vainglory as an impediment to friendship is very worthwhile, as are some of his comments on the relationship between hope and friendship. On the negative side, however, Schwartz does not sufficiently support some of his main original claims. A first example concerns his claim that Aquinas's notion of friendship "is more flexible and more able to accommodate disagreement and lack of mutual knowledge than that proposed by Aristotle" (viii). This may perhaps be true, but Aristotle's account is discussed so little that Schwartz's claim is never substantiated. One is left wondering whether the insights which Schwartz credits to Aquinas (about disagreement and lack of mutual knowledge) could not after all be insights Aristotle might have agreed with.

A second example concerns a section entitled, "Friendship as a condition of just exchange," in which it is argued that "for Aquinas, there is a sense in which friendship is not opposed to, but rather is a necessary feature of, the circumstances in which it makes sense to invoke justice" (133). Schwartz indicates that his discussion of friendship as a condition of just exchange is meant to apply only to the rewards for a person's actions, in cases where "the person who rewards is in a position of superiority to the recipient (i.e. father-son or God-human being)" (133). The use of "i.e." rather than "e.g." in this last quotation is puzzling, since it would suggest that Schwartz is limiting his discussion to cases of father-son exchange or God-human being interaction, whereas he in fact uses a master/slave example (164) and states some of his conclusions in the more general language of "inferior" and "superior."

Schwartz's main original thesis in this section is the claim that

(1) According to Aquinas, "when two persons are separated by a wide gap, the actions of the inferior do not lay just claims on the superior unless the inferior is a friend [of the superior]" (140).

By my lights, Schwartz is insufficiently precise in formulating this claim, and his argument for it is inconclusive. Schwartz never tells us what exactly he means by an inferior and a superior, or what would count as a "wide gap". Imagine that a wealthy landowner in some nation N makes an agreement with a fourteen year-old migrant laborer (a non-citizen of N), to the effect that if the laborer works for a day in the landowner's fields, the landowner will pay him a certain wage. Imagine, further, that the two have never before met, and are not friends. On a natural reading of (1), (1) would imply that

(2) According to Aquinas, the actual performance of the work by the laborer does not lay a just claim (to payment) on the landowner.

Because Schwartz does not say what he means by "inferior" and "superior" with sufficient precision, Schwartz's claim (1) could very naturally be taken to imply (2). But (2) is false. Aquinas believes that it belongs to the natural law and to natural justice that agreements should be kept (see Aquinas's commentary on Aristotle's Nicomachean Ethics, V.12.1019). So Aquinas would think that if the laborer performs his side of the bargain, then the landowner is obligated under pain of injustice to pay the laborer his wage. And this is simply to say that, for Aquinas, the actual performance of the work by the laborer would indeed lay a just claim on the landowner.

What's more, Schwartz's own argument for (1) is inconclusive. The central passage on which Schwartz bases his argument begins,

Now since in all gratuitous givings the primary reason of the giving is love, it is impossible for anyone, properly speaking, to lay claim to a gift, if he lack friendship.

[C]um autem in omnibus illis quae gratis dantur prima ratio dandi sit amor; impossibile est quod aliquis tale sibi debitum faciat, qui amicitia caret… (IV Sent. d. 15, q. 1, a. 3, sol. 4c, in Aquinas on Friendship, p. 135).

Schwartz attempts to argue from this claim of Aquinas's to (1). But Aquinas's claim here is about those things which are given gratuitously, i.e. about gifts; his claim is not about wages or other goods given in exchange. In this passage, Aquinas is discussing the conditions under which a human being has a just claim to receive something from God. Since Aquinas considers every good thing we have to be a gift from God, Aquinas's comments in the larger passage of which this quotation is a part might well be taken to imply that one human being never has a just claim to a gift from another human being, unless the two are friends. But nothing Aquinas says here suggests that the actions of a human being A never provide A with grounds to lay just claim to payment or recompense from another human being B, unless the two are friends. In making his argument from Aquinas's comments in IV Sent to (1), Schwartz appears to make an invalid inference from a proposition about when an inferior can lay a just claim to a gift from a superior, to a proposition about when an inferior can lay a just claim to a reward or payment from a superior. Aquinas's actual statement about gifts is reformulated by Schwartz as a statement about "benefits" (135 and 136), and then taken to imply a conclusion about any just claim whatsoever: "the actions of the inferior do not lay just claims on the superior unless the inferior is a friend" (140). All that Aquinas's text would in fact warrant is the claim, "the actions of the inferior do not lay just claims to gifts from the superior, unless the inferior is a friend."

In addition to these larger issues, Aquinas on Friendship also contains a number of more minor errors and misleading statements about Aquinas's views. After Schwartz introduces Aquinas's distinction between two types of union that can obtain between lover and beloved (real union and a union of affection), Schwartz asserts that "Affective union consists in some sort of apprehension and can take two shapes" (26). But for Aquinas, affective union is love (see Summa theologiae I-II.28.1), and love is an act of an appetitive power; hence affective union is not an apprehension. What Aquinas actually implies, in the passage to which Schwartz refers, is that affective union proceeds from a certain sort of apprehension:

The other [type of union] is according to affection, and this union must be considered in relation to the preceding apprehension, since appetitive movement follows apprehension. Now, since love is twofold, namely love of concupiscence and love of friendship, each of these proceeds from a certain sort of apprehension of the oneness of the thing loved with the lover. (ST I-II.28.1c)

A second example, this time of a misleading statement: Schwartz writes that "Electio is the act of the rational appetite" (p. 9, footnote 34). What's misleading here is the claim that electio (choice) is the act of the rational appetite (i.e., the will), since Aquinas distinguishes between no less than six acts of the will: enjoyment (fruitio), intention (intentio), volition (voluntas), choice (electio), consent (consensus), and use (usus). (See ST I-II.11-16.) Small errors like these don't affect Schwartz's main arguments, but their presence does take something away from his work.

These criticisms notwithstanding, Schwartz has made a welcome contribution to the growing literature on Aquinas's ethics, and his book will be a good resource for those interested in Aquinas's views on friendship.