Aquinas on One and Many

Placeholder book cover

David Svoboda, Aquinas on One and Many, Editiones Scholasticae, 2015, 156pp., $67.95 (hbk), ISBN 9783868385632.

Reviewed by Shane Maxwell Wilkins, Fordham University


Unity is a fundamental metaphysical concept. When I experience the mug sitting on my desk, I experience it as a whole, as a unit. But is the kind of unity that makes my mug one thing the same kind of unity that makes the concept of democracy one thing? If the two senses differ, how are they related? David Svoboda's book is the first monograph-length study of Aquinas's views on the nature of unity to appear in English. Svoboda has two aims, both exegetical. His primary thesis is that "Aquinas's multilayered and seemingly disconnected reflections on unity (and its negation, multiplicity) derive from a simple idea, which as an apex stone links them all in a single whole" (18). His first aim, in other words, is to provide an analysis of the concept of unity in Aquinas, which exposes the connections between the various uses to which Aquinas puts the concept in diverse places throughout his corpus.

On Svoboda's telling, the simple idea linking the variety of different uses of "unity" is the nominal definition: "unity is indivision," (i.e. the condition of not being actually divided.) He attempts to show how regarding unity as the condition of being undivided will allow one to provide a schematic analysis of Aquinas's five different broad uses of "unity" in terms of the things which are meant to be undivided.

However, Svoboda's book also seems to aim at a secondary target, which is to explain Aquinas's solution to an interesting problem about his definition of unity. To help motivate the problem, note that in his commentary on the Posterior Analytics, Aquinas holds that the terms in the definiens of a definition should be prior to and better known than the definiendum on the grounds that the definition is supposed to make manifest the essence of the thing.[1] Obviously then, Aquinas should reject circular definitions since two different terms can't both be better known than one another. But, of course, if unity is the lack of division, what could division be but the lack of unity? In other words, "unity" and "division" into a multitude would be two meaningless terms, circularly defined in terms of one another. Such a circular definition would seem to destroy the ability to use these terms to give us knowledge about the nature of things. And indeed Aquinas explicitly rejects the view on which "unity" and "division" would be a pair of interdefinable primitive terms.[2] I take it that the primary philosophical objection Aquinas must overcome is to provide some way of explaining how his definition of unity isn't circular in this sense.

With these two tasks clearly in view, we can turn to Svoboda's attempt to accomplish them.

The Interpretative Task: Five Kinds of Unity

Let's turn first to Svoboda's attempt to give a schematic analysis of the different uses to which Aquinas puts the concept of unity in various places. Since Aquinas holds that unity is the denial of division, Svoboda (46) begins his account of the various kinds of unity in terms of which kind of division is being denied.

Aquinas begins by distinguishing formal unities from material unities. A being is formally united by denying the division of something pertaining to its essence and materially united by denying the division of some of its quantitative aspects. There are three kinds of formal divisions: the transcendental division between being and non-being, the formal division between species of the same genus, and the numerical division between different numerically distinct individuals of the same species. Denial of each type of division yields a distinct type of formal unities. Furthermore, there are two types of material unities: the universal unity and quantitative unity. Universal unity is found in the beings of reason, such as universal concepts in the intellect abstracted from the experience of diverse particulars. To see why universal unity is a denial of a kind of material division, recall that Aquinas holds that concepts in the intellect are universal in virtue of abstracting away from the particular, determinate, quantitative features of particulars to yield the universal concept. Finally, to say that some physical body has material unity is just to say that its matter is continuous.

These five different senses of unity are illustrated in the chart below.


Type of Unity

What is undivided?

Formal Unities


Being qua Being

Formal Unity Proper

A species or genus


An individual

Material Unities


An intentionally existing concept of a genus or species



Here is my primary problem with Svoboda's analysis. He attempts to capture the table above with a device he calls "the universal schema of unity," which he defines this way: "If a being is one, then a predicate and its negation cannot be truthfully predicated of it at the same time" (48). His idea is that the various kinds of indivision represented on the table above can all be understood as different substitution instances of the second-order formula:

ⱯxU(x) ⇒ ¬∃P(P(x) ¬P(x))

Svoboda says, "Transcendental, formal and numeric unity can thus be described by means of the same schema, while the differences among predicates that best represent the unity in question" (48). Later he makes clear that he thinks the same holds true of universal and material unities (104, 107). I found the idea of this universal schema of unity perplexing. Different substitution instances for P cannot distinguish the different kinds of indivision because the formula "P(x) and not P(x)" is always false, no matter what predicate one substitutes for P. In other words, one cannot very well distinguish transcendental unity from formal unity by noting that the law of non-contradiction holds for transcendental unities but not for formal unities because the law of non-contradiction holds for absolutely everything.

Fortunately, Svoboda's exposition of the various kinds of unity is usually quite detachable from this universal schema of unity, so readers after an exposition of the texts in which Aquinas makes the distinctions in the chart above can still turn to Svoboda for valuable help.

Let us now turn our attention to the second task Svoboda set himself.

Is The Definition of Unity Circular?

Recall that Svoboda's secondary aim was to explain how Aquinas can avoid defining "unity" circularly. Here Svoboda (90) very helpfully points the reader to Aquinas's very important discussion of the origin of our knowledge of unity in the Quaestiones disputatae de potentia Dei, q. 9, a. 7, ad 15 ("Whether numerals are predicated of the divine persons?"), where Aquinas constructs a kind of logical deduction of the concept of unity from the classic Thomistic thesis that being is the first object of the intellect.

The deduction runs as follows. If the first object of the intellect is "being," then the second object of the intellect is "non-being." For having seen that some object has being, we can then immediately see that it is not a non-being. So the negation of being is subsequent to the apprehension of being. Having realized this, however, we now recognize that the distinction between being and non-being divides the beings from the non-beings, and so we discover that "division" is the third object of the intellect. "Unity" is the fourth object of the intellect because it is the application of the idea of negation to the idea of division. The idea of number, that is, unity in the category of quantity is the fifth act of the intellect insofar as it is true that to perceive a number of objects is to perceive a number of units. "And therefore," Aquinas adds in his laconic way, "there will be no circularity in the definition of 'one' and 'multitude'."[3]

Whether Aquinas's deduction is a satisfactory solution to the problem of explaining how one comes by the positive content of a primitive term like unity is a difficult philosophical question, beyond the scope of the present review. But here is one pressing question: Does the concept of unity have a positive content of its own or not?

Joseph Owens and R. A. te Velde hold that for Aquinas the content of the concept is negative. However, Svoboda joins Jan Aertsen and others in holding that Aquinas does indeed hold that the concept of unity has a positive content. Here Svoboda (84) cites Aquinas's commentary on the Metaphysics: "'One' does not signify a pure privation, for it does not signify indivision itself, but rather than undivided being." Further, Svoboda argues, persuasively to my mind, that Owens and te Velde have been misled by the surface grammar of the nominal definition of unity. (Svoboda takes his distinctive contribution to this debate [and his point of disagreement with Aertsen] to be his argument that the unity of the thing is found it its essence rather than its existence [84, fn. 58].) However, I left this section of the debate wondering whether Aquinas's way of deducing unity through a privation of division is really consistent with holding that the concept so deduced has a positive content. It is one thing to say we should not infer a negative content to the concept from the surface grammar of the nominal definition, but it is quite another to assert that the positive content of "unity" can somehow be derived from another concept by negation. I think Svoboda could have fruitfully expanded this section of the text. Be that as it may, Aquinas certainly has an interesting story to tell here, and Svoboda is clearly pointing us the right direction in looking for the details.


In my view, despite its occasional insights, Aquinas on One and Many suffers from two important limitations.

First, the scope of the book is quite narrow. Svoboda occasionally points to Avicenna's and Averroes's influence upon Aquinas's doctrine, and he occasionally references the great sixteenth century scholastics, but he has little to say about Aquinas's relations to his immediate predecessors and contemporaries. Readers looking for an historical arc to the problems Svoboda treats will be disappointed. It is unfair to blame an author for not writing a book he didn't set out to write, of course. However, even confining our attention just to Aquinas's own views on the subject, there are several significant topics that Svoboda foreswears. For instance, he explicitly declines to consider the kind of unity characteristic of analogical concepts (20, fn. 15). Since the doctrine of the analogous character of being is such an integral part of Aquinas's overall metaphysics, I found the omission of such a discussion strange. On the other hand, Svoboda does a good job situating Aquinas's views on unity in the context of certain of his theological commitments, such as the doctrine of the Trinity and the hypostatic union.

Second, I could not understand Svoboda's attempt to distinguish the different kinds of unity in terms of his universal schema, as mentioned above. Indeed, in at least one place the attempt is mistaken. For instance, in his discussion of material unities, Svoboda argues that the predicates which cannot be simultaneously affirmed and denied of material unities are proper names. He says in a note, "Some readers may find it surprising that we understand proper names as predicates that can be predicated of individuals," but then goes on to insist that, "Aquinas assumed . . . the copula of a proposition expresses some kind of identity of the subject and the predicate" (107, fn. 139). Svoboda then cites Peter Geach and Gyula Klima in support of his interpretation.

However, in his famous 1954 paper, "Form and Existence," Geach criticized the very view Svoboda is putting forward here under the label "the two name theory of predication".[4] On Geach's view, Aquinas holds instead to what the modern commentators like L. M. De Rijk and Klima have appropriately called the inherence theory of predication.[5] On this view, the subject and predicate of a true affirmation have two radically different modes of signification. The subject of the sentence supposits for an object and the predicate signifies a form as inhering in that subject. On this view, what makes a copulative sentence true is the existence of the form signified in the subject at the time of utterance and not the fact that the subject and the predicate are just two names for the same object.

For all these limitations, Svoboda's book remains a valuable contribution to the literature on Aquinas's views on unity. Svoboda is helpful on how Aquinas distinguishes numerical from transcendental unity, for instance. And he has a very clear discussion of the convertibility of the transcendental unity and being. These insights mean that the book will remain valuable to serious students of Aquinas in spite of the book's other limitations.


I would like to thank Nathan Ballantyne for valuable editorial help in preparing this review, and Turner Nevitt for discussion of Aquinas's conception of definitions.

[1] In Post. An., Book II, lectio 3, n. 2.

[2] cf. In Meta., Book X, lectio 4.

[3] "Et sic etiam patet quod non erit circulus in definitione unius et multitudinis." De potentia Dei, q. 9, a. 7, ad 15.

[4] Peter Geach, "Form and Existence," Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society 55 (1954-1955): 251-272. What Svoboda is calling "the identity theory of predication" is what Geach calls there the "Two-Name" theory.

[5] Cf. Gyula Klima, "Aquinas's Theory of the Copula and the Analogy of Being," Logical Analysis and the History of Philosophy, 5 (2002): 159-176.