Aquinas on the Metaphysics of the Hypostatic Union

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Michael Gorman, Aquinas on the Metaphysics of the Hypostatic Union, Cambridge University Press, 2017, 177pp., $99.99 (hbk), ISBN 9781107155329.

Reviewed by Matthew Kostelecky, St. Joseph's College, University of Alberta


This book is an attempt to provide a "highly-developed treatment exclusively of [Aquinas's] metaphysics of the hypostatic union" (11), the doctrine that in Christ two natures -- one human, one divine -- are united in one person. As Michael Gorman notes in his Introduction, this has not been attempted in the literature. There is, to be sure, significant coverage on aspects of the topic, but there is no account as systematic or comprehensive that is jointly centered on 'Aquinas', 'metaphysics', and the 'hypostatic union.' This entry to the literature is welcome, both for its subject matter and for its sympathetic, lucid exposition of a topic central to Aquinas's own thought. Gorman is a not merely reconstructing Aquinas's thought here, but is creatively, intelligently, and even daringly thinking along with Aquinas. His quarry is what Aquinas meant, not merely what he said, and if he thinks Aquinas has been unclear or left something unsaid that he should have dealt with, he says so directly and then attempts to give a sort of plausible reconstruction of what Aquinas would have or should have said on the topic. The book, thus, presents Aquinas's thought both sympathetically and critically, and treats in admirable detail many of the knotty problems generated by careful reflection on the hypostatic union.

The topic of the hypostatic union is not, to say the least, easy. To say that it was difficult for Aquinas and his contemporaries undersells significantly how they saw the issue, and new challenges have risen since. Indeed, while those in Thomas's time period and with his basic commitments were likely to look at the confounding issue through the positive lens of a mystery, it seems more likely that many today would look at the topic, if they look at it at all, as a curio contained in the other-worldly reliquary of medieval thought. Gorman is well aware that many of his own philosophical colleagues are unlikely to be positively disposed to the topic, though he spends little time worrying about their sensibilities. Instead, he gets on with his primary project of illuminating Aquinas's teaching on the hypostatic union in a stepwise and sensible fashion, insofar as he thinks that is possible. He starts with Aquinas's Aristotelian metaphysical commitments and builds out from there. What may be initially of interest to contemporary philosophers in Gorman's approach is his capacity to explain lucidly how Thomas's rather straightforward Aristotelian vocabulary serves as the basic framework for his attempt to make the hypostatic union more intelligible. This carefully wrought framework, however, gets pushed, pulled, and bent -- perhaps beyond its capacity -- to something that still sounds recognizably Aristotelian but has been changed in basic ways. As Gorman says in an understated manner, the hypostatic union is "somewhat subversive of our natural ways of thinking" (9).

The 'somewhat subversive' element here is really Gorman's focus, and he paints a picture of a vital thinker whose capacities are pushed to, and then quite possibly beyond, their limit. While the initial interest in this book by contemporary philosophers may well be in Gorman's capacity to explain Aquinas's Aristotelianism cogently, the really interesting material is found in the theological and 'subversive' terrain, where the metaphysical implications of a purportedly revealed doctrine show that the initial Aristotelian vocabulary (e.g., substance, form, essence) has to be altered in the attempt to make sense of the doctrine. Gorman's cogent explanation of Aquinas's Aristotelian framework is merely propaedeutic to the real task.

The doctrine of the hypostatic union was shaped in the early centuries of Christianity, and Gorman has an informative though not exhaustive tour of this complicated history from the Council of Nicaea (325 C.E.) down to Aquinas's own rich context, which helps the reader get her bearings. In its simplest formulation the doctrine states that Christ is one 'person', but that he has two 'natures' -- one divine nature and one human nature. Even a rudimentary understanding of the terms at play here implies serious problems for making sense of this teaching. How can a 'person', canonically defined by Boethius as an "individual substance of a rational nature," have two natures? Boethius's definition of 'person' seems to exclude a person's belonging to or having two natures and, according to our ordinary ways of thinking, it may not even be conceivable that an individual substance could have two natures. For instance, can 'Fido' be both fully of a canine nature and fully of a feline nature? Of course not, and Aquinas would agree (he sees the problem). There is, however, a big difference on Aquinas's account between a 'lateral' comparison between two created natures and a 'vertical' contrast between divine and human natures, and our ordinary ways of thinking tend naturally toward the former, lateral and mundane, sort.

After the introduction to the basic doctrine and its history, Gorman does not jump immediately into the details of Aquinas's Christological doctrine, instead electing in chapter 1 to build up a picture of what 'person' and 'nature' would look like for Aquinas had he relied only on reason without recourse, explicit or otherwise, to Christian revelation. Gorman's reason for choosing this route is fairly obvious: since 'person' and 'nature' are, according to him, terms available to "purely philosophical thought" (14), and since these are the very terms that are at issue in the hypostatic union, we should start with a robust understanding of the terms from a philosophical perspective, before things get really complicated. This sort of stratagem is a fairly well-trod path for contemporary Thomist philosophers, though -- I think it bears emphasizing -- the result is a contemporary construct made for contemporary, often philosophical, sensibilities or exigencies. What Thomas would have said about a topic had he not been influenced by Christian tradition can be difficult to arrive at with surety, but, moreover, the result is not in fact actually how Thomas thought. It is, rather, a construct made for propaedeutic or pedagogical reasons, and constructs like this should be acknowledged as such. Gorman says the following near the outset of the chapter 1: "Aquinas's Christological thinking, therefore, rests to a significant extent on his pre-theological, philosophical thinking" (14). I'm doubtful that there is such a thing in Aquinas as 'pre-theological' thinking, even if we can -- by force of hermeneutical acumen -- prescind Aquinas's philosophical and theological thought from one another.

Take, for instance, the term 'persona,' which is one of the terms Gorman takes to be available to purely philosophical thinking. The term is of distinctively Christian provenance (unlike 'nature') and was introduced into technical Latin discourse by Tertullian, in the context of Trinitarian discussions, and defined authoritatively for the tradition by Boethius in a theological tract that deals explicitly with Christological controversies. What would it mean for a medieval thinker, like Aquinas, to think of 'person' denuded from Christian revelation? It would probably look much like what Gorman presents in this chapter (basically, an individual thing, a 'supposit' in technical language, capable of understanding) even if it is unlikely that any medieval thinker, Aquinas in particular, prescinded 'person' as carefully as Gorman does here from its original theological goal and meaning. Again, this sort of move is fairly common, and Gorman needs some sort of stable foundation upon which to present Thomas's account of the hypostatic union, especially if contemporary philosophers are to have an access point, so I don't begrudge him his decision. Rather, a monograph as carefully constructed as this, focused exclusively on the 'metaphysics' of a purported revealed doctrine, would do well to treat this sort of methodological issue with greater detail.

After the first chapter Gorman turns to the hypostatic union directly and spends the rest of the book treating progressively more difficult or even possibly intractable Christological issues, trying to show how Aquinas resolves various problems regarding the hypostatic union or trying to resolve problems in Thomas's own formulations on the issue. Thus, chapter 2 presents the basic outlines of Aquinas's view on the Incarnation and chapters 3-6 deal with problems, both prima facie and fundamental, that arise as Aquinas confronts the doctrine.

Chapter 3 treats problems that arise from the divine side of the hypostatic union, like how God can be simple while Christ, who is fully God, seems to be a composite of human and divine natures or how divine immutability is compatible with God becoming a man. Chapter 4 turns to problems arising from the human side, mainly, how Christ's human nature is real while not grounding a supposit, which is left to the divine nature (and natures are real insofar as they ground an actual supposit). Chapter 5 turns from considering problems related to one or the other side of the divine/human person to problems pertaining to the unity implied in the hypostatic union, namely, how many existences (esse) there are in Christ? One, as from his person or two, as from his two natures? Chapter 6 turns to consider whether Aquinas's understanding of the hypostatic union is internally consistent. Throughout all of this, Gorman is a creative and incisive expositor. In chapter 2 Gorman makes a distinction, not found in the very words of Aquinas, between 'human nature' and 'human reality' and to which he returns profitably for the rest of the book. In chapter 5, he negotiates carefully among recent commentators who, he argues, have misconstrued or misunderstood Aquinas. There are far too many details and interesting explorations in each chapter to cover here, so rather than going into these and other details, I think it is more germane to consider Gorman's principle of procedure, which he announces in the introduction of the book and to which he stays faithful throughout.

From chapter 3 onward, Gorman focuses his attention on areas where Aquinas's thought is unclear or problematic. He explains, "Sometimes Aquinas expresses himself rather casually -- the idea that his formulations are always rigorously strict and consistent is an obfuscating myth" (7). A result of this approach to Aquinas is that Gorman will fairly frequently fill in gaps that he sees in Aquinas, or give the most plausible and intelligent reconstruction of Aquinas and, when even that is found wanting, will then engage in a sort of "speculative reconstruction of what it would make sense to say from [Aquinas's] perspective" (76). As such, sometimes on Gorman's view Aquinas is "underdeveloped" (or some such) on a given issue, so Gorman then endeavors to come up with a theory that is consistent with what Aquinas does say, but that he doesn't actually say. At these points, the book is in danger of ceasing to be "Aquinas on the hypostatic union" and risks becoming a work inspired by the general principles of Aquinas. To my mind, this is not at all bad, but I can see two different and opposite critical reactions to Gorman's approach. First, strict Thomists may well rankle under the "speculative reconstruction" that Gorman engages in, for sometimes it seems that the adjective 'speculative' is doing a lot of work in that two-word term. Second, to those scholars of medieval thought who are not particularly positively disposed to Aquinas, it may well seem that Gorman is going to extraordinary lengths to save Aquinas from himself and that, in all honesty, Gorman would be better off just to say Aquinas was wrong or underdeveloped or unclear and move on to consider other thinkers. For my own part, I like what Gorman is doing throughout the whole, because he is really trying to get at what Thomas meant, rather than what he said, and he proceeds with a sort of refreshing bravura. He takes Thomas seriously and thinks along with him, being neither dismissive nor uncritical. I did not find all of his speculative reconstructions persuasive, but they were unfailingly interesting and intelligent.

Importantly, there are several things that this book is not. It is not a footnote-laden display of erudition nor a genealogical tracking down of Aquinas's own sources. It is not an account of the effect that Thomas's teaching on the hypostatic union had in his later contemporaries or the subsequent tradition. For instance, neither Albert the Great nor John Duns Scotus get much mention, for they are not Gorman's focus. It is not a book on the hypostatic union, as such. It is, rather, as the title promises, focused on the metaphysical implications and underpinnings of Aquinas on the hypostatic union and it is carefully, crisply written. When Gorman finds something wanting in Aquinas on that issue, he says so and then attempts to give a plausible filling in or reconstruction.

Now, as I noted at the outset of this review, Gorman is correct to say that his book is unique in the literature: there are no other book-length treatments of similar sophistication on Aquinas on the hypostatic union. From another, wider perspective, however, the book fits into a burgeoning literature, and one which I think would be foreign to thinkers like Aquinas (or Scotus or any number of other medieval thinkers). Indeed, I think that our recent propensity to produce literature of this sort says more about our current context than it does about the source texts, even though this literature is interesting and informative. For lack of greater perspicacity, I'll call this growing literature in medieval research "The Metaphysics of [insert revealed doctrine here] genre."[1] Several things immediately strike me as noteworthy here: I can only find one non-English entry in the genre and that one has a fairly careful appropriation of the term 'metaphysics'; also the sense of 'metaphysics' is usually left undefined (so far as I can find, Gorman never defines exactly how he's using the term) and, to the best of my discernment, it is used as it would be in a contemporary graduate class in an English-speaking philosophy department.

Moreover, this is not at all the sense in which an Aquinas or a Scotus use the term 'metaphysics'. It is, rather, a bit anachronistic, for metaphysica in the 13th and 14th centuries is not simply a discussion about basic presuppositions or a discussion about the status of how things exist or a discussion of the bundle of issues that seem to fall (accidentally? haphazardly?) into contemporary metaphysics. Rather, for the 13th and 14th centuries, it denotes a sub-discipline of philosophy, the most fundamental part, which is undertaken according to very precise criteria and fitted necessarily in the subalternate structure of Aristotelian scientia. In this case, metaphysics fulfills the role of underwriting the whole façade of human knowing and, in Aquinas's mind, metaphysics occurs by way of a reduction to first principles, like the principle of non-contradiction. Metaphysics, for Aquinas, is a science that takes ens commune as its subject and is explicitly contrasted to revealed theology (i.e., sacra doctrina). The hypostatic union, by contrast, is a revealed teaching, which Aquinas endeavors to explain (with a keen sense that this cannot be done exhaustively) and to show how the teaching is not self-contradictory. I simply don't think that a 'metaphysics of the hypostatic union' would make much sense to him, whereas it is so close to contemporarily trained philosophers as to elide definition or explanation. I think that this book (and other similar treatments, though those are beyond my scope for now) would do well to explain exactly the sense in which the term 'metaphysics' is being used, especially since the author is using the term in a way foreign to Aquinas's own conception of that term.

None of this is to take away from the value of the book. It is a genuine contribution, it will be useful for Thomists and other specialists, and the writing is engaging for both specialists and non-specialists alike. I would recommend the book to anyone looking to learn more about this distinctively Christian teaching, especially within the backdrop of how Aristotelian metaphysics is stretched to account for what, prima facie, cannot be accounted for on that framework.

[1] For example, Marilyn McCord Adams, "The Metaphysics of the Incarnation in some Fourteenth-Centrury Franciscans," in Frank and Etzkorn eds., Essays Honoring Allan B. Wolter (St. Bonaventure, NY: Franciscan Institute Press, 1985), pp. 21-57; Bernard Bro, "La notion métaphysique de tout et son application au problème théologique de l'union hypostatique," Revue Thomiste 67 (1967), pt. 1, pp. 29-62; Richard Cross, "Aquinas on Nature, Hypostasis, and the Metaphysics of the Incarnation," The Thomist 60 (1996): 171-202; Richard Cross, The Metaphysics of the Incarnation: Thomas Aquinas to Duns Scotus (New York: Oxford University Press, 2002); Eleonore Stump, "Aquinas's Metaphysics of the Incarnation," in Davis, Kendall, and O'Collings, eds., The Incarnation (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2002), pp. 197-218 (see also chapter 14 of Stump's Aquinas, titled 'The metaphysics of the incarnation'); J.L.A. West, "Aquinas on the Metaphysics of Esse in Christ," The Thomist 66 (2002): 131-150; J.L.A. West, "Aquinas on Peter Lombard and the Metaphysical Status of Christ's Human Nature," Gregorianum 88, 3 (2007), pp. 557-587.