Aquinas's Ontology of the Material World: Change, Hylomorphism, and Material Objects

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Jeffrey E. Brower, Aquinas's Ontology of the Material World: Change, Hylomorphism, and Material Objects, Oxford University Press, 2014, 327pp., $74.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198714293.

Reviewed by Richard Cross, University of Notre Dame


Jeffrey E. Brower’s aim is to give an account of Aquinas’s views of the material world and its fundamental constituents. He sets about this task in five main stages — and because of the complexity of the argument I will devote almost the full first half of this review to a description of it, before turning to criticisms. The first part of the book (chapters 1 and 2) argues for the claim that Aquinas accepts 14 fundamental types of being: prime matter, accidental unity, God, created substance, substantial form, and each of the nine Aristotelian accidental forms (p. 47). According to Brower, each of these types of being corresponds to a distinct mode of being (for example, for prime matter, existing “in the mode of non-particularity”; for accidental unity, existing “in the mode of non-basic particularity”; for God, existing “in the mode of absolute independence”; for created substance “in the mode of [dependent] basic particularity” (p. 46). Following some unpublished work of Kris McDaniel’s, Brower claims that “a thing possesses a mode of being if and only if it falls under a certain sort of quantifier” (p. 51): one of a group of restricted existential quantifiers that are “both semantically primitive and more fundamental than the unrestricted quantifier” (p. 51). Brower claims that Aquinas’s modes of being, understood in this way, are (in the words of Robert Pasnau, whom Brower quotes to this effect), “ontologically innocent structures”: so, “modes do not add anything to one’s ontology over and above their possessors” (p. 52).

The point about these fundamental types of being is that all of them — except for God — enter into composition in various ways, to form hylomorphic compounds. Brower introduces the notion of a hylomorphic compound by considering what Aquinas has to say about change. All kinds of natural change, according to Aquinas, involve a substratum and some kind of form. So Brower’s initial characterization of a hylomorphic compound is functional, derived from an analysis of the way in which substratum and form function in change. This is the topic of part 2 (chapters 3 and 4). Crucial is the distinction between substantial and accidental change, set out in chapter 4, because this yields two types of form (substantial and accidental), two types of substratum or matter (prime matter and created substance), and two types of hylomorphic compound (created substance and accidental unity), and these comprise the basic types of being of the created world.

Chapter 4 is central in another way too. Both substantial change and accidental change present puzzles, and the solution to those puzzles — discussed in this chapter — allows Brower to introduce two further claims that turn out to be critical for the overall account of Aquinas’s position. The puzzle about substantial change is this. Substantial change involves the persistence of prime matter, something that is “pure potentiality,” in Aquinas’s words, or a “mere subject of endurance,” in Brower’s (p. 86). But, as Aquinas’s medieval critics noticed, the notion of a mere subject of endurance seems to be incoherent, since forms are essentially such as to characterize their subjects (and nothing else is). The solution is that forms characterize the compounds that they constitute, but they inhere in (without characterizing) the other constituent of the compound: the substratum, prime matter. (It is, after all, Socrates who is a human being, not his prime matter.) So a substantial form characterizes the substance that it constitutes without so characterizing prime matter.

The puzzle about accidental change is this: given the distinction between inherence and characterization, it does not seem that a substance, as a substratum, can be characterized by its accidental properties; only the accidental whole composed of the substance and an accidental form can be so characterized. The solution draws on a line of Aristotle interpretation dating from the 1980s: substances and the accidental unities of which they are parts are numerically the same without being identical (p. 92). Specifically, the relation of numerical sameness-without-identity is satisfied in the case that two hylomorphic compounds share the same prime matter (p. 94). The accidental form can then derivatively characterize the substance in virtue of that substance’s sharing the same prime matter as the accidental unity of which it is a constituent.

The third part (chapters 5 to 7) sketches out the notions of matter and form, and thus moves beyond the functional hylomorphism of the earlier chapters. Brower argues that Aquinas conceives of prime matter as atomless gunk that is non-individual. The claim that Aquinas understands prime matter to be non-individual is, as Brower notes, quite original: “Commentators . . . seem not to have appreciated the . . . close connection between individuality and actuality” (p. 122). The non-individuality of matter explains, among other things, how it can possess a form that fails to characterize it: it is “not of the right ontological type or category to be so characterized” (p. 127). In chapter 6, Brower argues that Aquinas’s hylomorphism is a kind of substratum theory, thereby locating Aquinas’s theory in a taxonomy of modern views and showing that it is distinct from all of them. There are two types of substratum — property complex: first-order complexes (i.e. material substances), which have non-individual atomless gunk as substrata; and second-order complexes (i.e. accidental unities), which have material substances as substrata (p. 148). (A later chapter finesses this distinction by allowing a place for immaterial hylomorphic compounds, as we shall see.) Chapter 7 is entirely devoted to a defense of the version of hylomorphism sketched in the earlier chapters — a defense of its truth against modern rivals.

Brower next turns to the question of material objects (part 4). He begins, in chapter 8, by showing that Aquinas’s view of material objects requires a particular form to inhere in matter — thus rejecting unrestricted composition for material bodies. (Hardly a surprise to anyone acquainted with Aquinas, but typical of Brower’s painstaking approach to the task of locating Aquinas’s views among a taxonomy of modern theories.) Brower goes on to show that Aquinas accepts immaterial hylomorphic compounds too: immaterial unities composed of an immaterial substance and an accidental form (the archangel Gabriel thinking about something, for example). And lest this seem too surprising as a matter of terminology, Brower quotes a passage in which Aquinas is prepared to allow a sense in which anything related as potentiality to some actuality can be labeled ‘matter’: and Gabriel is in potentiality to thinking about something. In line with this, Aquinas rejects the view of some of his contemporaries that any hylomorphic compound must include prime matter. So what is distinctive about material objects is that they contain prime matter. Chapter 9 fills in some details on the varieties of material objects: heavenly bodies, terrestrial ones, living bodies, types of material unity and the accidents that can characterize them, artifacts (Brower defends the line, contested but I think highly plausible, that Aquinas accepts that some artifacts are substances). In chapter 10, Brower argues that accidental unities, as much as material substances, count as material objects, and he lays out on Aquinas’s behalf principles for counting by identity (under some sortals) and by numerical sameness-without-identity (under other sortals). A substance and the accidental unity of which it is a constituent turn out (according to Brower) to be distinct hylomorphic compounds but one and the same object.

The three chapters of the fifth and final part introduce various “complications,” mainly of a theological nature (transubstantiation, the human soul, the afterlife). Angels and God are, of course, theological items, but as Brower reads Aquinas, none of these entities generates any theoretical difficulties for Aquinas’s hylomorphism. The complications make a difference to the overall scheme in various ways, though I doubt that these theological modifications will be of much interest to the readers of this review.

I should say at the outset that I learned a huge amount from reading this book. I learned something about contemporary metaphysics, and I learned a lot more about some of the strategies available to interpreters wanting to present medieval metaphysics to a modern audience. But I should say too that I found reading the book both exhilarating and exasperating (albeit not in equal degrees, with more of the former than of the latter quality). Exhilarating, because the reader is clearly in presence of a powerful philosophical mind developing an account of material constitution that represents a genuine and novel contribution to contemporary debates. Exasperating, because that mind is not Aquinas’s, or not for the most part, but rather Brower’s, at least for the most part. I do not intend, therefore, my exasperation to detract from the metaphysical project, which strikes me as rich and worthy of further discussion. Aquinas has never before struck me as a really deep metaphysician, but the insights that Brower has derived from reflection on Aquinas are little short of remarkable.

The initial sketch that I gave of Brower’s view on the 14 basic types of reality and of the modes that explain these types already gives some clues to the radical originality of his reading. For example, it is clear that Aquinas talks about modes of being at various points in his discussions, and that these have not until now attracted the kind of treatment that they merit. But I am not sure that Aquinas has a theory of modes, and I am quite sure that, whether or not Aquinas has such a theory, it is not the one that Brower describes. Equally, while it seems to me to be highly plausible to suppose that Aquinas accepts accidental unities, I remain to be convinced that he accepts the theory of numerical sameness-without-identity that Brower ascribes to him. Indeed, I think there is evidence to show that he does not. Finally, there are no real indications that Aquinas believes prime matter to be non-individual in just Brower’s sense. I will discuss these three issues in turn.

According to Brower, each of the 14 categories of being he identifies in Aquinas is associated with a distinct mode of being. Take one of the accidental categories, and use ‘accidental mode of being’ to refer to the mode associated with that category. It would follow from Brower’s analysis that an item could not exist in that category unless it were associated with the relevant accidental mode of being. But Aquinas understands the modes associated with the accidental categories in precisely the opposite way: something can remain an item in a category but lose the relevant mode — for example, by coming to exist (miraculously) in separation from a substance. Here is what Aquinas says about the case of the Eucharist (in a text not referenced by Brower):

Being-in-[a-subject] (inesse) does not signify the being (esse) of an accident absolutely. Rather it signifies a mode of being which pertains to it from an order to the proximate cause of its being (esse). And because, if we take away the order of an accident to its proximate cause there remains its order to the first cause, according to which its mode of being is not being-in-a-subject but being-from-another (ab alio esse), it follows that God can bring it about that there is an accident that is not in a subject. And this will not take away the being (esse) of an accident, but its mode of being. (Aquinas, Super libros sententiarum IV, d. 12, q. 1, a, 1, qla. 1, ad 1)

Now, it is true that Aquinas here is in fact talking about the mode of being attaching to an accident as such, not the mode of being attaching to (say) quantity. And Brower could claim that this generic mode of being is not fundamental, or not irreducible, and thus not part of Aquinas’s official account of modes of being — a distinct mode for each accidental category. But, of course, this “official” account is of Brower’s own devising, with, as he himself acknowledges, no substantive textual support (see his scattered comments on pp. 49-50). (Brower posits it because it makes sense of the fact that motion simultaneously belongs to the categories of action and passion. So it does; but there are other options on the table for that.) I doubt, too, that this account of modes is, as Brower claims, ontologically innocent. Modes can, after all, come and go; and I think we would be owed some account of how this might be, given their innocence. (I can think of possible ways, but the issue would need some work.)

Neither, I think, can we find a text which claims that an accidental unity has such a mode. Why? Because Aquinas simply has not given as much sustained and systematic attention to the question of accidental unities as Brower has. And this takes me to my second issue: that of numerical sameness-without-identity. Brower’s reading is no doubt possible. But interpreting Aquinas in this way is made much harder by Aquinas’s apparent failure in other contexts to understand the distinction (assuming there to be such) between absolute identity and the relation of numerical sameness-without-identity. There is an area of Aquinas’s thought in which he talks about relations similar to these, and what he says suggests that he does not carve up the terrain in quite the way that Brower does. The relevant issue is the mysterious Christian doctrine of the Trinity, according to which there are supposed to be three divine persons, each of which is God (equivalent, according to Aquinas, to the claim that each person is the divine essence), such that the persons are nevertheless not identical to each other. Aquinas maintains that what is salient in making non-identity claims is simply the signification of the various terms: ‘person’ and ‘essence’ have different significations (they “differ according to the reason of our understanding”) and are thus not substitutable salva veritate in all contexts. Thus, he reasons, each person is in some sense the same as the essence, but

to the extent that essence and person in God differ according to the reason of our understanding, it follows that something can be affirmed of one that is denied of the other, and consequently that, when one is the subject [of a given predicate], the other is not. (Aquinas, Summa theologiae I, q. 39, a. 1 ad 2)

It seems to me at least arguable (and I would be prepared to argue it) that this in effect makes the substitutability of terms necessary for the identity of the things signified by the terms — which is clearly too tight a requirement. So the corresponding numerical sameness-without-identity relation will be defined too loosely, including cases of non-substitutability that we would count as nevertheless satisfying Leibnizian requirements for identity. Equally, and more damagingly, Aquinas expressly maintains that the relation of numerical sameness-without-identity fails to be transitive: suggesting that he has at best a very theoretically undeveloped account of this relation, whatever it be — because at the very least we would suppose that two things that are numerically the same as a third would be numerically the same as each other. (For non-transitivity, see Summa theologiae I, q. 39, a. 1 c, where Aquinas discusses the relations that are supposed to distinguish the divine persons from each other: “Relation, compared to the essence, does not differ in reality but only in reason, whereas when compared to the opposing relation it has, in virtue of this opposition, real distinction.”) Admittedly, the domain is different: the Trinity, as opposed to hylomorphic compounds. But the worries I have are purely formal, and thus in principle affect the latter as much as the former. This suggests that Aquinas does not have the technical tools to make the kind of explicit commitments that Brower’s reading requires him to. It also problematizes Brower’s attempt to provide Aquinas with some rules for counting (by identity or by numerical sameness-without-identity) under different sortals: it seems that Aquinas would not quite accept either of Brower’s two kinds of sameness relations, and a fortiori would not have known of, or asserted, Brower’s rules for counting under those different relations.

The third issue that strikes me as worthy of comment is the claim that prime matter should be construed as non-individual. Brower cites a text in support of his view. Here it is, in Brower’s translation:

Two things belong to the notion of an individual — namely, (a) that it is a being in actuality, either in itself or in another (in se vel in alio), and (b) that it is a being divided from all other things which are (or can be) in the same species, though it is undivided in itself. (In sent. ad 3; quoted on p. 122)

There are, indeed, many other texts that say similar things. But what is striking about the text is the very next sentence that follows it, not included by Brower:

Therefore, the first principle of individuation is matter, by which there is acquired being (esse) in actuality for any . . . form, whether substantial or accidental; and the secondary principle of individuation is dimension, because by virtue of this, matter is made to be divided.

There is a lot that could be said about this, since (among other things) the teaching is not entirely clear. On the face of it, the linking of matter and individuation seems to tell against Brower’s reading. But, again on the face of it, the last two clauses perhaps support what he says, since it seems that matter requires extension in order to be divided into particulars. The situation is more complex, however, because it turns out that the distinction between the two kinds of matter — with and without extension, or, as Aquinas puts it elsewhere, between designated and undesignated matter — is a distinction between concrete and abstract (this chunk of matter vs. matter as such: see Aquinas, De ente et essentia, ch. 2, passim, not discussed by Brower); and the distinction between concrete and abstract here is not a distinction between individual and non-individual gunk, but between something real and something posited purely for theoretical purposes (see De ente et essentia, ch. 4, passim).

I do not by any means take these brief comments to provide a refutation of Brower’s reading; on the contrary, what I have said probably supports something distantly akin to his interpretation. But Brower’s discussion would have benefited from a far closer engagement with a much wider range of texts, especially since Aquinas makes some distinctions that are somewhat in the neighborhood of Brower’s, but interestingly and significantly different from his. And this, it seems to me, is true of much of the book. Key parts of the argument rely on very thin evidential support, and this adds to the impression that one is reading Aquinas from the outside, as it were, and not from the inside.

Having said this, it is nevertheless clear that reflection on Aquinas’s sometimes scattered and unsystematic remarks on topics relevant to questions of material constitution allowed Brower to make this distinctive contribution to contemporary metaphysics. And I think, ultimately, that that is how we should best think of the book. There are (almost) as many references to David Armstrong as there are to Aristotle. Brower’s major dialogue partners are Ned Markosian, Hud Hudson, Kris McDaniel, Mike Rea, Ted Sider, and Dean Zimmerman. It would be fascinating to hear what these analytic metaphysicians would have to say about the theory of material substance adumbrated here by Brower.