Aquinas's Theory of Perception: An Analytic Reconstruction

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Anthony J. Lisska, Aquinas's Theory of Perception: An Analytic Reconstruction, Oxford University Press, 2016, 353pp., $99.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198777908.

Reviewed by Paul Symington, Franciscan University of Steubenville


Aristotle's theory of perception in general, and Aquinas's view in particular, are of increasing interest to students of Aquinas's system of thought, especially for those interested in adapting these views to more contemporary treatments in the philosophy of mind. These views bring together accounts of sensation that have intuitive teleological and formal structures, while pointing to important embodied components to complete the accounts. Unfortunately, Aquinas is not always absolutely clear on the meaning of the terms that he employs to explain his theory of perception and his writings on the topic are interspersed throughout his corpus. In this book Anthony J. Lisska does an admirable job not only of compiling relevant texts that address the nuts-and-bolts of Aquinas's theory, but also of interpreting them in a very coherent and plausible way. At several points I found the book rather illuminating and worth the time invested in it. Beyond textual analysis, Lisska provides helpful comparisons with modern and contemporary philosophers (oftentimes treated in a chapter appendix) to the main purpose of showing how Aquinas's view does much to avoid the epistemological pitfalls inherent in the representationalist view of perception which carries through the modern period and beyond. (I should mention, by the way, that an eye to addressing enduring philosophical problems in their own right is a helpful way of establishing accurate textual interpretations, since great philosophers such as Aquinas are correctly thought to be keenly aware of such problems and motivated to overcome them.) However, although Lisska's contributions on explicating Aquinas's realist view are very valuable, I shall point out some other possible problems that linger which future work on Aquinas's thought will need to continue to address.

Pointing out that there is renewed interest in an Aristotelian approach to philosophy of mind and perception, in the first chapter Lisska provides justification for focusing his discussion on Aquinas's seminal Commentary on Aristotle's De Anima. Indeed, throughout, Lisska deftly analyzes and interprets Aquinas's theory of perception while appreciating both the rich contemporary philosophical problematic framing the issue and the important relationship between the thought of Aquinas and that of Aristotle. In particular, Lisska is keenly interested in showing the kind of harmonious pairing that exists in Aquinas's work between the ontology of primary substances as foundational to metaphysical theory and what Lisska identifies correctly as a kind of realist epistemological naturalism. Aquinas's perspective is naturalist in the sense that it is at home with the notion that evolutionary processes of adaptation are explanatory for understanding the particular cognitive structures (Aquinas's principle: the cognitive faculties exist for their acts and these acts exist for their objects). It is not surprising that Lisska articulates Aquinas's position as anti-foundationalist and externalist insofar as it is a species of medieval cognitive faculty psychology. A major task of the book is to build a plausible theory that is non-representationalist, seeking to avoid the perennial problems that stem from it.

In chapter two, Lisska discusses the principles that support Aquinas's theory of intentionality, which is itself fundamental to understanding his theory of perception and knowledge. The metaphysical condition that provides for intentionality -- 'aboutness' -- is esse intentionale (as opposed to esse naturale); x has intentionality of y if and only if x has the form of y (which is not the form of x) within itself without the matter of y. This yields intentionality since such a condition brings about the likeness of the thing known in the knower in such a way that the likeness is not itself the object of thought but rather the means by which y is aware of x. With this as background, Lisska identifies a number of principles of intentionality, of which the central one is Principle D-1: a knower is, by definition, any 'X' which has a set of dispositional properties to acquire or exemplify acts in a non-entitative or non-materialist manner (p. 47). Essentially, a being with intentionality is in potentiality to be acted on by the object of which it is aware and can only be actualized by members of the set of objects of possible awareness. That which is received and that which actualizes are 'specifically' the same with distinct embodiments. The embodiment in the subject with intentionality is in a non-physical (yet not necessarily spiritual) way.

In the third chapter, Lisska seeks a preliminary "rough-in" for Aquinas's account of intentionality within the paradigm of rationalism/empiricism. The thrust is to decouple Aquinas's view from representationalist theories of mental content. An advantage of Aquinas's approach is that it might be able to move beyond representationalism. Lisska follows John Haldane's call to enhance simple efficient or mechanical causes with their formal causes (a formal cause Lisska identifies as an inherent structure which is determinative of a thing's sortal properties). On one hand, Aquinas adheres to an empirical spirit in his embrace of the maxim that nothing is in the intellect which is not first in the senses, and his recognition that injury to the organs of sense hinders the intellect. On the other hand, Aquinas's direct epistemological realism (the object of knowledge is not an idea, but the thing itself) comes by way of his view that there is a formal identity between the knower and the known.

In chapter four, Lisska begins a more textual focus on sensation and perception for interpreting Aquinas. He fleshes out Aquinas's empiricist features in his notion of faculty dispositions as a medium between act and potency showing that Aquinas's faculty psychology is outside of the constraints of a typical physicalist approach. Lisska introduces the act/potency distinction in Aquinas to account for the kind of change that is involved in cognitive processes. He points out a difference between cognitive changes and natural changes and between conceptual formation and perception. Regarding the former, whereas with physical changes there is a destruction of a contrary when its contrary comes to be (e.g., when a substantial change occurs, a thing is destroyed to make room for the new substance) this is not the case with cognitive changes. Regarding the latter, Lisska points out that there are different degrees within the act/potency relationship. At the basic level there is disposition-1, which "is the state in which any given potential knower finds herself when she has the ability or capacity to know" (p. 98). This disposition-1 can be actualized (actuality-1), producing a habitus of knowledge. The in-between state is when there resides a habitus of knowledge but it is not being enacted at the present moment. This is what Lisska calls disposition-2. Disposition-1 is the native state of all rational animals and exists in a place in which the set of habits of knowledge that are possible for them are determined by the content of their substantial form. As such there is no actual knowledge within each person innately and what is required is a more complex interaction with the intellectus agens and sense perception to be realized. This is not the case with sensation. From the start, the external sense faculty is found in the state of disposition-2/actuality-1 and so just needs the presence of its proper sensible object to be engaged.

In chapter five, Lisska gets into Aquinas's ideas on the proper (e.g., "the reds, the C-sharps, and the sweets of this world," p. 122) and common (size, shape, motion, rest and number) sensibles as the object of perception. The objects of sensation are the acts for the potency of the sense faculty and so the latter exists for the sake of the former. Whereas the common and proper sensibles are perceived directly, that which is sensed only incidentally are Aristotelian primary substances. This is because with regards to sensation, although someone is sensing Socrates, it is only incidentally so, since what they are directly sensing are the colors, size, and motion of Socrates. Lisska further points out that there is an important distinction to be made between the organs of sense and the sense faculty. Although Aquinas has a non-physicalist understanding of sensation, the structure and proper functioning of the organs are necessary conditions for sensation to occur. The organ is the subject and matter for the power of sensation, which has as its object things such as colors and sounds. In this way, the organ itself has a certain structure and proportion suitable to receiving sensible forms such that changes to the organ will correspond to changes at the level of sensation. Only when there are problems with the organs of sense itself will there be any error at the level of sensation of proper sensibles. At higher levels of sensation and perception, more systemic errors can occur.

In chapter six, Lisska moves to examine specifically Aquinas's views on the acts of awareness appropriate to sight (which is the most perfect of the senses, as opposed to touch, which is the root and foundation for the senses). This makes up part of his discussion of the mental acts proper to the external sensorium (which includes the external senses and the sensus communis). He focuses very much on the notion of medium as a necessary condition for sensation. Although color existing in the external world is essentially visible, and is the proper object of the faculty of sight (as opposed to merely the sensible species in the eye by which the color is seen), yet it requires a transparent medium to be affected by the color to be able to act on the faculty of sight. He continues in chapter seven a discussion of external senses by identifying the three necessary relations with the external senses that must hold for an act of sensation to occur: there needs to be a sensible object, an adequate medium, and a properly disposed sense faculty. This last condition requires proper disposition both with respect to the formal faculty itself -- the success of the sensible species being related to the intentionality of the agent -- and the material condition, which is the proper physical operation of the organ of sense itself.

In the remaining chapters, Lisska provides a fascinating analysis on the internal senses, which are encompassed by the sensus communis, the imagination, the vis cogitativa, and the memory; each which plays an essential part in an agent's awareness of the world. In the eighth chapter, Lisska focuses on the first of the internal senses, the sensus communis. The necessity of this faculty is to explain our experience of complex wholes. We can tell the difference between 'red' and 'sweet.' This ability implies that we have a common sense that is able to simultaneously conjoin these distinct properties (as a bundle of properties) and to recognize them as distinct. It also accounts for our ability to be aware that we are sensing, and can be thought of as the seat of perceptual consciousness. Aquinas thinks of this faculty as well as the root of sensation in that it "terminates several organically distinct sensations" (p. 206) and as such portrays in experience concrete wholes, which reflect the furniture of the world more holistically. The sensus communis is part of the external sensorium, which accounts for the unity of sense awareness as such and so does not form a sense object distinct from that of the external senses (p. 214).

The other three internal senses -- the imagination, vis cogitativa, and the memory -- specifically require for their operation the presence of the elusive phantasm. In chapter nine, Lisska disambiguates the use of the term 'phantasia' in Aquinas's texts, arguing that sometimes he uses it to refer to the internal senses (excluding the sensus communis) and other times only to refer to the vis imaginativa, which is the subject of the chapter. Whereas the external sensorium is for the reception of sensible forms, the imagination is for the retention and preservation of these forms. "It is by means of the imagination that a person conserves her experience of concrete wholes so that every working of the external senses in conjunction with the sensus communis is not a totally new kind of awareness" (p. 227). As a consequence of this function, an agent is able to perform a compositive function whereby one can compose images of golden mountains and suchlike, and for this reason the veracity of the imagination is not to be trusted since it functions independently of the presence of an object of sensation (although within an awareness of the image as if it were present).

In chapter ten, a main interest of the book is presented: the role of the vis cogitativa in the perceptual theory of Aquinas. This is an innate structure which provides awareness of the individual and is an incidental object of sense and the direct object of perception. Due to higher functioning associated with this faculty, Aquinas argues that this faculty is only in rational animals. In non-rational animals, there is a faculty called the 'estimative power' which allows animals to react not just to a bundle of properties but to what can be identified as an individual -- the sheep can be said to respond (through natural instinct) to the wolf even though it is unable to sense the wolf as such. With the 'cognitive power' in humans, one is able to be aware of an individual as individual and is able to distinguish individual intentions and compare them; for this reason it is sometimes referred to as 'particular reason.' In itself, though, it works in an interpretive or Gestalt fashion ('seeing as') beyond the bundle of sensations given through the sensus communis (merely 'seeing'). It works intimately with the active and possible intellects to present the individual perceived as being of a certain essential kind.

In the final two chapters, Lisska seeks to unravel the complicated notion of "phantasm" in Aquinas's works, and provides a nice way forward for getting clearer on the notion. In chapter eleven, he detaches the cognitively rooting notion of the phantasm from a sense datum view and a view in which it is equated always with an image. Rather he argues that for Aquinas the phantasm should be thought of as a likeness by which the internal sensorium performs its retentive and interpretive functions. Lisska argues that in an important sense, "a phantasm . . . [is] a 'residue' of the unified composite whole sensed by the sensus communis from the discrete data received from the external sense" (p. 293). As special domain of the internal sensorium (excluding the sensus communis) there are phantasms that are proper to vis cogitativa, memory and imagination. The phantasm relevant to the imagination (Phantasm-1) is the residue from the mental awareness "in accord with the necessary conditions of sensing using the external sensorium" (p. 301) and in itself need not be an object of awareness, although it can be. In addition to the role of imagination as storehouse, the phantasm is used by this faculty to be the object of awareness (as when remembering a direct sensation) and to be the object of imaginative combinations (e.g., Hume's golden mountain). Through the Phantasm-2 (which is not an object of direct awareness), the vis cogitativa "structures an act of direct awareness that the object in the external world, the concretum, is interpreted perceptually as a specific, unified whole of a particular kind, and not merely as a collection of proper and common sensibles" (p. 305). Since the memory is merely the storehouse of intentions obtained through the operation of the vis cogitativa, so too the corresponding phantasm is merely the stored Phantasm-2 (which is itself a conditioned awareness) which contains the temporal characteristic of 'pastness' (involving not just bundles of sensations but individual things). These three phantasms are brought together by introducing the higher cognitive functioning of the agent intellect: "It is through the vis cogitativa, together with the imagination and the memory, that the phantasms are prepared to receive the addition of the intellectus agens, whereby they are made actually intelligible" (p. 318), thereby bringing the book to its natural endpoint.

Although Lisska does an effective job in showing how Aquinas's position on perception avoids the kind of representationalism ('theater of the mind' view) that leads to epistemological problems and away from realism, I believe that there are some other worries based on Lisska's interpretation that might create problems for a thorough-going realist position. To a lesser extent, the problem of mechanism lurks in the background. Mechanism is the bottom-up, anti-teleological approach to explaining higher functioning in virtue of the movement of parts of the so-called whole, which can lead to the anti-realistic position of eliminitivism of mind. Although Lisska accurately points to Haldane's recent work arguing for the enhancement of an account of mental processes by bringing in formal causation, there is always a danger that shifting to a more formal account renders the underlying mechanistic account an after-thought. Thus, a mediated view which identifies a point of contact between the subject of intention (which will be amenable to a more mechanistic-objectivistic account) and intentional awareness would be beneficial as would be, following Thomas Nagel's request, putting "more thought . . . to the general problem of subjective and objective."[1] Although certainly, matching up physical mechanisms discovered in cognitive science with the intentional workings of perception is a way to do this, I believe that there are some resources in the works on the natural philosophy of Aristotle and Aquinas that can fill in some of these details as well.

However, constructivism is perhaps a more serious problem to undermine the realist view of Aquinas. Constructivism casts a suspicious light on a realist epistemology in that a version of it holds that all knowledge is a (arbitrary) construction from sense perception. Lisska's account of the vis cogitativa might lend itself to the view that Aquinas's position is not immune to the philosophical conclusion that the structured individual (which goes beyond the bundle of sensations identified in the external world through the common sense) is a construction of this faculty in way that is disconnected from the reality of the object in the external world. This problem is perhaps enhanced by the observation of Lisska that for Aquinas the individual is only incidentally sensed and is not causally efficacious for sensation. Perhaps the answer to this question lies in the functioning of the agent and possible intellects, which are beyond the scope of Lisska's book.

In all, Lisska's book is a welcome addition to the literature on Aquinas's theory of perception.

[1] Thomas Nagel, "What is it Like to Be a Bat?", The Philosophical Review 83 (1974), p. 450.