Are Liberty and Equality Compatible?

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Jan Narveson and James P. Sterba, Are Liberty and Equality Compatible?, Cambridge UP, 2010, 278pp., $85.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780521883825.

Reviewed by Helga Varden, University of Illinois at Urbana-Champaign



Are Liberty and Equality Compatible? is part of a new series called ‘For and Against’ by Cambridge University Press. The aim of the series, general editor R. G. Frey tells us in his foreword, is to present core arguments in an ongoing philosophical dispute in a way accessible also to the enlightened public. Given this aim the arguments presented in the book are, naturally, neither new nor philosophically challenging for those familiar with the debates. The texts primarily contain ideas that the authors have been working on for a long time, now presented in a condensed and accessible form. And overall I believe that this book is quite successful in presenting many core arguments ‘for and against’ an important issue in political philosophy, namely the question of whether or not there is a necessary conflict between liberty and equality. Therefore, Are Liberty and Equality Compatible?, in addition, provides a good starting point for exploring those prominent libertarian traditions that do not get attention in the two monologues it comprises.

The book also, albeit presumably non-intentionally, unfortunately illustrates some of the peculiar features of the debate between left- and right-wing libertarianism. In particular, it employs a strangely provocative style of argument and use of examples and a rather careless use of empirical data. For example, on the basis of rather minimal empirical support — none of which is original — James P. Sterba concludes that we can presently only rightfully consume enough material resources for subsistence plus some conveniences (a ‘decent’ life). For anything more, he claims, would make it impossible for all peoples presently living or in the future to cover their basic needs. Similarly surprising from a philosopher is Jan Narveson’s claim — when reflecting upon a friend’s trip to the pyramids — that as a matter of fact Egyptian beggars think they would wrong wealthy tourists if they took a little of their plenty. Narveson even maintains that ‘enormously needy’ persons actually don’t think they have a reasonable claim on wealthy tourists’ plenty — a simple fact he thinks ‘softhearted academics’ like Sterba and Peter Singer ‘ought to see’ (182). Naturally, such empirical speculations are not philosophically interesting. Indeed, given that the two monologues aim to show the in/compatibility of freedom and equality, these empirical claims would be irrelevant even if they were correct. Fortunately, however, if one is able to look past these annoying distractions, Narveson’s and Sterba’s texts also engage many of the interesting arguments and issues in this debate.

Part of what makes Sterba and Narveson’s debate whether liberty is compatible with equality fruitful is that both thinkers agree that the successful argument is consistent with a so-called ‘negative conception of liberty’. According to this conception, fundamental importance is attached to each individual’s right freely to set and pursue her own ends with her means as long as she does not interfere with the freedom of others. No one is required to assist others in obtaining means of their own or in helping them pursue ends (‘positive freedom’). What Sterba and Narveson explore is whether or not the commitment to negative liberty is compatible with a commitment to equality regarding resources. Sterba argues that negative liberty is not only compatible, but actually requires a commitment to equality, which Narveson patently denies. So, the selection of these two philosophers to represent the opposing sides in this debate couldn’t be more perfect. The conclusions following from Sterba’s argument that liberty and equality are compatible puts him in the far, far left corner of libertarian thinking, whereas what follows from Narveson’s denial puts him in the opposite, yet equally extreme, right-wing corner.

Libertarians all agree that an individual’s rights enable his freedom, meaning his ability to set and pursue ends of his own. Moreover, libertarians consider the proper sphere of justice to comprise individuals’ enforceable rights and duties. Without enforceable rights, the possibility of each individual’s freedom is subject to other persons’ consent, which is inconsistent with setting and pursing ends of one’s own choosing. And because we are embodied beings freedom requires private ownership of external means. Hence, a general puzzle facing libertarians concerns how individuals can obtain non-consensual, or enforceable, private property rights in external means in a way compatible with freedom for all. How can one individual’s unilateral acquisition of some thing external to herself entail others’ obligations to stay away from that thing, or, even more generally, how — if at all — can one person’s unilateral exercise of freedom issue obligations on other persons’ exercise of freedom? Both Sterba and Narveson aim to answer this question.

Sterba’s solution is that unilateral acquisition by one person issues obligations on others only if the acquisition is compatible with everyone being able to access sufficient means to cover basic needs. Basic needs are taken to include at least ‘food, shelter, medical care, protection, companionship and self-development’ (13f n.14, 89, 110), though in one place Sterba also includes ‘transportation’ and ‘self-esteem’ (110). It is crucial to Sterba’s conception of justice that actual interaction is not necessary to ignite the existence of rights. In this sense, Sterba’s view is non-relational. Instead, Sterba sees distributive justice as tracking states of affairs with respect to the distribution of resources among existing and future persons. Moreover, it is essential to Sterba’s conception that a person can unilaterally authorize herself to secure resources on behalf of those who have none. Because rights do not track actual interaction and relations between persons and since those with resources can enforce everyone’s rights, Sterba concludes that welfare rights can be secured for everyone, where everyone includes the vulnerable, distant others and future persons. Acting consistently with everyone’s right to welfare, in turn, is to use up resources only as required to fulfill basic needs — a ‘decent life’ — and nothing more (35). Sterba correspondingly thinks that if the lack of property is due to one’s own fault by, for example, having wasted one’s fair share of resources, then the right to welfare does not apply (20ff, 49, 65, 90, 107). Finally, Sterba holds that sufficient charity can do the work of ensuring the just distribution of resources (76f). Hence, as long as there is a Bill Gates providing sufficient help to the poor there is no injustice with regard to the overall property distribution of resources. Indeed, if necessary, Bill Gates can act as a global Robin Hood insofar as necessary to ensure that everyone — presently and in the future — enjoys basic goods (116n).

The idea that resourceful persons have the right to act on behalf of vulnerable, distant and future others is important to Sterba. Unfortunately, however, this claim as well as other aspects of his account are problematic. To start, Sterba does not explain how anyone, and anyone in particular, unilaterally can obtain the right to act on another’s behalf, including persons who don’t exist and persons whose incapacitation entails that they cannot consent. Second, an implausible implication of Sterba’s view that rights do not track actual interaction and relations is that someone can be wronged even though no one does anything wrong. For example, the disabled and sick poor, together with immobile distant others and non-existing future persons, (will) find themselves without access to their fair share of resources. But on Sterba’s account, no one is under a duty of justice to enforce their rights, since such a conception would be inconsistent with a commitment to negative freedom. Nevertheless, they are, somehow, wronged. Third, even if we can make sense of how the more resourceful obtain the right to act on behalf of those incapable of acting on their own rights and even if the more resourceful choose to do so, the ‘rights’ of the incapable are then dependent upon the voluntary choices of the resourceful. Yet, if the possibility of incapable persons’ actually enjoying ‘rights’ is dependent upon existing, resourceful persons’ voluntary choices to act on their behalf, then surely the incapable are not secured rights.

There is also, I believe, a series of problems attached to Sterba’s conception of a non-relational, yet libertarian conception of rights. First, the idea that rights track non-existent persons appears inconsistent with the libertarian, negative conception of freedom. According to this negative conception, remember, I have a right to set and pursue my ends insofar as my exercise of freedom is consistent with other persons’ rights to do the same, which is to say that reciprocal freedom is rightful freedom. Yet if I am the only one existing, then there is no one with whom to be in a reciprocal relation and therefore no one to wrong. Another problem related to Sterba’s non-relational account is illustrated by Sterba’s claim that charity can take the place of justice. Sterba argues that if there is plenty of charity then people do not need or have welfare rights. In fact, he argues, it would be better if voluntary contributions to the poor took the place of welfare rights (76f). As long as someone else is sufficiently generous, my property is seen as justified in relation to the poor. But this doesn’t seem correct on a libertarian account. Presumably, my rightful private property claims in relation to another person must be justified independently of what others choose to do with their property. What others do with their possessions must be irrelevant to my right to my possessions. If we only have a rightful claim to six tomatoes and I wrongly possess seven, then it is irrelevant that two of my neighbors out of the goodness of their heart give three tomatoes each to a newcomer. My seventh tomato is still not rightfully mine even though the newcomer now has six.

My final set of objections concerns Sterba’s claim that the right to welfare covers a right to access basic goods, namely food, shelter, medical care, protection, companionship and self-development, and possibly also transportation and self-esteem. Note that this list includes a mix of goods, some of which necessarily require other persons’ labor, knowledge and effort. Clearly, medical care and protection fall into this camp. Other goods, such as companionship, self-development and self-esteem have an emotional, interpersonal element. But Sterba provides no explanation of how an enforceable right to these goods can possibly be reconciled with everyone’s right to freedom, negatively understood. How can I remain free to set and pursue my own ends with my means if others have a continuous, enforceable claim on my labor, effort, knowledge, and emotional involvement? Perhaps at this point Sterba will point to the dependence of his position on a reasonable degree of altruism. Naturally, if people are unselfish and devoted to each other’s welfare, then they will act altruistically. This debate, however, is concerned with what people can be forced to do. So, there must be an argument justifying the coercion of altruism. But if I am forced to give my labor, knowledge and emotional effort to the poor, then surely I’m not acting altruistically. Rather, I’m being forced. Hence, altruism cannot do the work of justice here since it is in principle impossible to enforce altruism — just as it is impossible to enforce emotional involvement of the right kind.

Narveson takes issue with Sterba’s egalitarianism by arguing that there is no individual right to a equal, fair share of resources and so only voluntary, private charity can rightfully do the work of redistributing resources from the rich to the poor (234-44). Narveson rejects any position that insists on a right to an original fair share of the material resources in the world, including Robert Nozick’s right-wing libertarian position. Narveson argues that the world is just insofar as everyone originally owns themselves (their own bodies) and acquires any private property either by being the first possessor of unowned material resources or through voluntary exchanges with others.

To illustrate Narveson’s position, imagine a group of people sailing the Pacific Ocean at time t0. Suddenly they are overcome by a storm, which destroys their boat. Fortunately, they manage to swim ashore on a desolate island — an island, from which, incidentally, it is impossible to leave. As they arrive on the island, each person, as fast as she can, starts taking control over the various parts of the unowned island. Even though some are able to acquire more than others (because they are stronger, quicker, etc.), according to Narveson, whatever anyone is able to grab first is rightfully hers. The fact that different people are able to acquire different quantities and qualities of material resources is irrelevant to the justice of the resulting distribution, since ‘nature’ and not the involved persons are responsible for these differences. Moreover, assume that at t1, say 50 years later, another ship is hit by an equally devastating storm and two survivors swim toward the island. To add complexity, assume that one of the two survivors is pregnant, and due to the extraordinarily strenuous swim, she gives birth in the water just before reaching the shore.1 Thus, three newcomers arrive on the island. At this point in time the descendants of those originally shipwrecked own everything on the island.

According to Narveson, the newcomers, including the newborn baby, have no right to acquire any private property since their situation is one of bad luck — a situation brought about, again, by nature and not by any of the involved persons. Indeed, according to the position Narveson defends in Are Liberty and Equality Compatible?, the newcomers do not have rights to anything in space and time at all except their own bodies. The islanders can push them off the island without wronging them; they can offer them only slave contracts in exchange for survival, and they can punish them if they try to stay on the island and steal food to survive. In fact, even if the original landowners have agreed to create some public areas on the island, the newcomers would not have a right to exist there. Naturally, the property owners may — and Narveson insists are likely to — choose to provide charity to the newcomers or to hire them as waged laborers, but they do not have an enforceable duty to do either. Narveson maintains — by drawing on Tocqueville’s writings — that if they do show charity, then the newcomers ought to show them gratitude and a virtuous bond is likely to form between them (238). Moreover, if the newcomers are hired, then assuming sufficient resources, there will be greater development of industry and a prudential boon for everyone. And finally, if the islanders neither show the newcomers charity nor hire them, then although they are clearly shown to be immoral, heartless, and imprudent, still they haven’t done anything unjust. A just world is seen as fully compatible with some having a life that is ‘solitary, poor, nasty, brutish, and short’, even though others could alleviate their miserable condition, the miserable have done nothing wrong, and the miserable are not responsible for their condition.

For Narveson, there is a just world in which some people have no rightful access to material means except through others’ consent, and the possibility of a person’s freedom, due to no fault of his own, can be subject to others’ voluntary choices concerning whether or not to provide him with charity, employment, slavery or nothing. In my view, however, such a claim is inconsistent with Narveson’s fundamental commitment to libertarian freedom. Remember that the original puzzle for libertarians is to explain enforceable, individual rights to material resources on a model of each person’s right to freedom, which is reciprocal freedom. Yet it seems that such a commitment to reciprocal freedom is inconsistent with some person(s) being forced into a situation in which they have no freedom at all. Narveson’s claim that one person’s setting and pursuing of any ends at all, indeed the possibility of existing in space and time at all, can be made subject to some other person’s actual consent is simply the abandonment of reciprocal freedom as the basis of the theory. Instead of right understood as reciprocal freedom, we end up with mere might. The likelihood that the rich will consent to give the poor access to their resources is entirely irrelevant. What matters is whether or not we have conceived of the normative relations between persons as in principle consistent with each person having an enforceable right to freedom, which is what Narveson’s account fails to do. When consent has to do the work of explaining the possibility of some persons’ rightful access to material means as such, the account fails to yield a theory of private property appropriation consistent with each individual’s enforceable right to freedom. Moreover, note that there is no reason based on rational interest why the newcomers should accept Narveson’s claim that the original property owners can choose to offer nothing. So, even from a Hobbesian point of view Narveson is wrong, since acceptance simply cannot be seen to be in their rational interest.

To justify his conception of private property acquisition Narveson at times appeals to Kant and in particular to Kant’s “Doctrine of Right” (131, 167). But in these cases, Narveson conveniently picks and chooses features of Kant’s position without also engaging any of the related literature. This lack of a fuller engagement with Kant and Kantian scholarship is particularly unfortunate since Kant, as explained by several recent interpretations, actually denies the libertarian conclusions Narveson draws from their agreed upon starting point. According to Kant, the main problem with an account like Narveson’s is its implication that the resulting restrictions on interaction issue merely from unilateral choices rather than from universal law, which is inconsistent with a commitment to each individual’s right to freedom.

The right to freedom, on Kant’s view, is each individual’s right to independence insofar as her exercise of freedom is consistent with everyone’s freedom under universal law, or reciprocal freedom. Therefore, any restriction issuing from a unilateral decision to appropriate a piece of property would be an obligation incurred due solely to an arbitrary choice, which is inconsistent with a right to freedom. Yet at the same time, of course, it must be possible to acquire things as one’s own without first asking, since needing permission is inconsistent with a person’s right to freedom. Clearly, then, Kant continues, someone like Narveson is correct in thinking that the first two steps in original property appropriation must be (1) taking control over something external to me and (2) letting others know that I have done so. Yet, in contrast to Narveson, Kant argues that there must be an additional, third step if my unilateral acquisition is to be rightful appropriation, that is, consistent with everyone’s right to freedom. Kant’s Rousseauan answer here is that the thing I have unilaterally taken control over is only ‘provisionally rightful’ until it is confirmed by a public authority, meaning an authority that represents all the interacting persons and yet no one in particular. Only such an authority – namely, a common agency — can yield restrictions on everyone that are consistent with a basic commitment to each individual’s right to freedom. Hence, the establishment of a public authority is ideally, and not just prudentially, necessary for rightful private property acquisition.

Kant continues, in the “Doctrine of Right”, that establishing the necessary public authority requires instituting not only private right, but also public right. Private right concerns the rights and duties private individuals hold against one another, whereas public right concerns claims citizens have on their public institutions. And importantly for this discussion on the compatibility of equality and liberty, public right includes certain redistributive measures to secure all citizens’ right to freedom. For example, the public authority must institutionally guarantee that no citizen is left in a situation where any legal access to means is subject to another private citizen’s arbitrary choice, such as another’s willingness to provide charity or employment. This is accomplished through a public, institutional guarantee of unconditional poverty relief. Without such a guarantee the public authority’s monopoly on coercion is irreconcilable with each citizen’s right to freedom. Importantly, moreover, if Kant’s argument concerning the necessity and structure of public right for the existence of rightful relations is successful, then not only Narveson’s, but the libertarian conception of justice as such fails. If public right is necessary for liberty and if public right is not reducible to private right, then the compatibility of liberty and equality is not one that can be envisioned at the individual level — it requires us also to explore the institutional structure of the liberal state rather than merely the libertarian state.

1 The point of adding this complexity is simply to ensure that the example includes at least one person who has never had any property. To make it less imaginary, we could, alternatively, imagine the children of a propertyless family — i.e. persons who do not have anything to inherit and according to Narveson’s conception of justice do not have a right to anything.