Are We Bodies or Souls?

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Richard Swinburne, Are We Bodies or Souls?, Oxford University Press, 2019, 188pp., $19.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780198831495.

Reviewed by Thomas Nagel, New York University


Richard Swinburne is a dualist of long standing, in the tradition of Descartes, and in this book he offers a comprehensive exposition and defense of the position, which makes its philosophical motivation clear. Even those who are not persuaded can be grateful to Swinburne for explaining the distinctive appeal of this significant view, which is often treated in contemporary discussion of the mind-body problem as an obsolete historical curiosity -- or a bogeyman for which it is the task of philosophy to discover palatable alternatives.

Swinburne's substance dualism of individual souls and bodies is opposed not only to all forms of psychophysical reductionism, but to anti-reductive forms of mere property dualism or dual aspect theory. According to Swinburne, each of us is an individual soul or self, a purely mental substance whose only essential property is the capacity for consciousness, and whose identity is independent both of the body to which it is attached and of the contingent experiences and other mental states and events that make up our actual conscious lives. Each of us recognizes this unique individual in our own case simply as "I". As Swinburne puts it, "We know who we are."

There is a methodological question at the heart of this topic: How much authority should be given to judgments made from the first-person point of view? Most disagreements among philosophers of mind can be traced to different answers to this question. There are hard-line reductionists who regard all subjective appearances with suspicion, think anything real must be describable in the objective terms of physical science, and are even prepared to regard consciousness as an illusion. Others admit the reality of consciousness and the irreducibility of its phenomenological features, as revealed to the first-person point of view, but think the nature of the person or self cannot be understood apart from the objective conditions, mental and physical, by which we identify and reidentify human beings other than ourselves. Swinburne, resisting such compromise, accords decisive authority to certain first-person convictions and intuitions, much in the manner of Descartes, as the basis for direct knowledge of our nature -- knowledge of a kind that can neither be grounded nor called into question by external empirical observation.

Swinburne proceeds in three stages. First, he argues that a simple, indivisible subject -- neither physically nor psychologically analyzable -- is the answer to the traditional problem of what constitutes personal identity over time. Second, he argues that this subject is a purely mental substance or soul distinct from the body, and that each of us is essentially this soul, rather than a combination of soul and body. Third, he discusses the causal interaction of soul and body, in both directions, and the natural laws that govern those interactions. I shall limit my comments to the first two topics.

Swinburne's response to the problem of personal identity relies on the strong intuitive judgment that whether a particular person identified in the present will exist at some time in the future has a definite yes or no answer, and if the answer is yes, there is a unique answer to the further question who that person will be. I will either exist a year from now, or not, full stop: it can't be indeterminate, or a matter of degree. And I will exist, if I do, only as a single self. This intuition -- which anyone can feel the force of -- appears originally in my thoughts about myself, but it extends naturally to our thoughts about other selves, if we think about them by taking up their point of view.

Reliance on the authority of this first-person judgment underlies the two explicit arguments Swinburne offers against alternatives to the simple theory of personal identity: the arbitrariness objection and the more-than-one-candidate objection. Alternatives to the simple theory all propose complex conditions -- physical, mental, or mixed -- for the identity of a person over time. Swinburne points out, correctly, that any analysis of personal identity in terms of physical continuity of the organism or brain, mental continuity of experience, memory, character, and so forth, or some combination of the two, will inevitably entail the possibility of borderline cases in which it is not clear whether the conditions have been met. Some of these cases are actual and some merely hypothetical, but a criterion of this type cannot give a decisive yes-or-no answer unless it draws an arbitrary line at some point in the spectrum of cases of partial brain replacement or psychological discontinuity. The charge of arbitrariness in Swinburne's objection is that the slight physical or psychological differences between two cases that are close to the line but on opposite sides of it are inherently unsuited to constitute something as momentous and all-or-nothing as the difference between my existing and my not existing. It is the simplicity and starkness of those alternatives, as presented to first-person intuition, that makes any analysis by a point on a continuum of complex properties seem arbitrary. As Swinburne says,

surely it is reasonable for some P1 who knows that she is going to undergo a brain operation which would involve replacing 51 per cent of her previous brain matter to hope to survive the operation. It looks as if there is an important truth about whether P1 will survive, which cannot be settled by an arbitrary philosophical definition of this kind. (p. 53)

Yes, from P1's point of view it certainly looks as if there is an "important truth" of this kind -- as if the question must have a definite yes or no answer. The difficult philosophical question is whether this conviction might be an illusion, better given up in favor of a more external conception of P1 and her prospects, according to which there is not always a determinate answer -- as with the survival of other complex things in borderline cases (same restaurant, same bicycle). Admittedly the intuition that "I" is never indeterminate does not go away on reflection, but may it not be an illusion nonetheless -- an illusion we are stuck with because no alternative is imaginable from the first-person point of view?

The situation is similar with Swinburne's more-than-one-candidate objection. He imagines a double transplantation case with a divided brain, and the subject asking whether she will be the person who receives her left hemisphere, or the person who receives her right hemisphere, or neither. A complex physical or psychological theory of identity can give no nonarbitrary answer to this question. The first-person intuition on which Swinburne relies is that not only must there be an answer, but it cannot be that the person will survive as both. The antecedent person cannot be even partially identical with two subsequent persons who are distinct from one another:

If the experiences of Alex and of Sandra [the successors] were both in some sense also Alexandra's [the predecessor's] experiences, then whoever has one experience should be in some degree aware of having the other experience. For if someone is not to any degree aware of some experience, that experience is not in any sense their experience. (p. 61)

Swinburne here rejects as unintelligible the idea of the self splitting into two noncommunicating halves, which would permit the antecedent subject to look forward to two separate streams of consciousness, each of which would seem to itself like a continuation of the original one. This first-person intuition of uniqueness seems to me less robust than the intuition that whether I will exist at all must have a definite yes or no answer. The possibility that I might have a divided consciousness seems subjectively imaginable in a way that future indeterminacy does not. But even if I am wrong about this, there remains the question whether these subjective judgments are immune to revision on the basis of third-person physical and psychological observations.

Swinburne concludes:

The failure of all such complex theories leaves us inevitably with the 'simple theory of personal identity': that there are no necessary or sufficient conditions for personal identity in terms of the degree of any feature of which there can be degrees. The obvious thing to say is that in all cases, physical and mental continuity (and perhaps also connectedness) with a previous person is evidence of identity with her, but does not constitute it. The more P2 has of P1's brain, and the more P2 a-remembers what P1 did and experienced, the more probable it is that P2 is P1; but being P1 is something other than and beyond the evidence for it. (p. 65)

The next question Swinburne takes up is this: In what does the simple identity of the person over time consist? To get the answer that it consists in the persistence of a pure mental substance, or soul, he must rule out the possibility that it cannot be analyzed further -- that it is simply a brute fact, about which nothing further can be said, that a future person will or will not be me. Swinburne's argument against this possibility is subtle and not altogether convincing. He imagines another transplant case:

If the two cerebral hemispheres were taken out of the brain of a person Alexandra's skull, and one of these was put in the skull of another person Alex from which the corresponding hemisphere had been removed, it would be logically possible that the resulting person is Alexandra and also logically possible that the resulting person is not Alexandra. (p. 68)

Swinburne claims that these are two distinct possibilities even if in both of them the physical facts are exactly the same, as well as the mental facts, understood as the complete description of the new Alex's mental properties. So there must be something else that distinguishes them:

Since the two possible humans (Alexandra and the person who is not Alexandra) would have all the same properties, they could only be different from each other if one has a part which the other lacks. And, since they have all the same bodily, that is physical, parts, they must differ in the respect that one of them has a certain pure mental part which the other lacks, which I will call their 'soul'. (p. 70)

But it isn't clear that a theory of mere property dualism cannot make sense of the difference between these two possibilities. Even if the only substance involved is the body, which is the same in both cases, and the body has irreducibly mental properties which are qualitatively the same in both cases, why couldn't those mental states just have the further property of being Alexandra's in one case and not in the other? In the vein of first-person intuition that drives Swinburne's arguments, this seems imaginable without recourse to the presence or absence of a further, purely mental substance that underpins it.

Swinburne's next step is to argue that, although a human being is the combination of a soul and a body, each of us is essentially not a human being, but just a soul -- a purely mental substance without physical properties. His argument for this Cartesian conclusion is a variant of Descartes': that though he has a body, it is conceivable that while he is thinking, he ('I') and his mental life should continue while his body is suddenly destroyed. The essence of the argument is this first-person judgment about what is sufficient for his existence, and what is unnecessary. (The possibility here is metaphysical possibility: he does not claim that it would be causally possible for him to go on thinking if his body were destroyed -- only that it is conceivable.)

As with the previous appeals to first-person intuition, the crucial philosophical question is whether this one can maintain its authority, in determining what is really possible, in the face of doubts supported by a more external view of the person. Can we be sure that our first-person grasp of ourselves and who we are is sufficiently complete and accurate to allow us to determine with confidence the necessary and sufficient conditions of our existence, just by thinking?

Swinburne faces this question directly. He observes that many contemporary philosophers would say that Descartes "does not know to what substance he is referring by 'I', and so he is in no position to assess what is logically possible for that substance to be or do. And, they claim, each of us is in just the same position of ignorance about what we are referring to by 'I'." (p. 85) In fact, the objection is not new: Arnauld offers a version of it in the fourth set of replies to Descartes' Meditations.

To answer it, Swinburne introduces a distinction between what he calls informative and uninformative designators.

I define a word as an 'informative designator' iff it is such that if we know what the word means, necessarily we know what is the object (substance, property, or whatever) to which it refers (its 'referent'), in the sense that we know what it is for an object to be that object and so we know what I shall call the 'essence' of that object. I define a word as an 'uninformative designator' iff it is such that even if we know what the word means, we do not necessarily know the essence of the object to which it is referring; that is, know what it is to be the object to which it is referring. (pp. 86-7)

Uninformative designators include definite descriptions like "the tallest building in London" or prescientific natural kind terms like 'salt' (whose meaning does not include the information that it is sodium chloride). Informative designators include terms like 'postage stamp' or 'proton', that can be defined verbally. But ultimately these definitions must come to an end with some terms whose meanings we understand more directly. Swinburne describes these as "words whose meaning we know in virtue of being able to recognize straight-off instances of them." (p. 88) The examples he gives include 'line', 'angle', 'red', 'door', 'road', 'side', 'shoe', 'cat', 'flower', 'kiss', 'London', 'the Eiffel Tower', and the names of numbers. Swinburne then says the following:

In the case of words whose meaning we know straight-off and so are able to recognize under ideal conditions whether or not they apply, we know -- simply in virtue of knowing the meaning of the word -- what it is for the object to which they apply to be that object; we know the logically necessary and sufficient conditions for something to be that object . . . Hence these words whose meaning we know straight-off are all informative designators. (p. 90)

This claim is crucial to his argument, for Swinburne will go on to assert that each person's use of 'I' to refer to himself meets these conditions. But the general claim seems dubious. There is no necessary connection between a capacity to recognize immediately some thing or property, and knowledge of its necessary and sufficient conditions. The way that the recognitional capacity works may be quite opaque to the person using the term, even if the recognition itself is fully conscious. This seems clearly to be true of some of Swinburne's examples, like 'kiss', 'line', and 'London'.

What about 'I'? Swinburne wants to establish that, used by each of us about himself, it is an informative designator of a mental substance. But he begins with the broader subject of mental properties, claiming that for each person, the words referring to his own mental properties are informative designators for that person, though not for others. This is because each person has privileged direct access to his own mental states, in contrast to the indirect evidential access he has to the mental states of others. He knows without the possibility of error what pain is in his own case, provided he knows the meaning of the word.

But does it follow that he knows everything about what pain is? Clearly he knows its essential phenomenological character, which is sufficient to identify it when he experiences it. But it might also have further essential features, perhaps physical, which though inseparable from how it feels are not included in the meaning of his first-person concept of pain. Perhaps the concept is incomplete. Each person may have a form of access to the nature of his own sensations that is superior to the access of others, but it does not follow that his access tells him everything about their essential nature.

The same problem arises when we come finally to the reference of 'I'. It is certainly true that with this term I cannot fail to pick out accurately the subject of my experiences. In using it I refer to myself straight-off, in an unmediated way that is not available to anyone else: I can't misidentify myself. But it does not follow that I know what I am referring to by 'I', in the sense of knowing all the logically necessary and sufficient conditions for its existence. Only if I had such complete knowledge could I discover by first-person reflection alone that it was conceivable that I should continue to exist while my body was suddenly destroyed. And so far as I can tell, Swinburne has not shown that my privileged access to my own identity necessarily involves such knowledge, i.e., that 'I' is an informative designator.

Swinburne goes on to claim that the soul has haecceity or 'thisness', independent of all its other properties. This means that it would be logically possible for the biological organism Thomas Nagel to have been born to my parents and gone through a life exactly like the one that I have led, physically and mentally, but with a different self or soul -- so that I never existed. Again, this dreadful possibility is supported by a vivid first-person intuition, but can the intuition be trusted?

There is a standoff here. Swinburne has shown that our first-person self-awareness appears to reveal a mental reality independent of anything physical; but we can take this appearance at face value only if we are confident that the mental has no metaphysically necessary connections with the physical that are concealed from the first-person point of view -- which is precisely the issue. If Swinburne is right, we know who we are. If he is wrong, his arguments show that our natural sense of ourselves includes a large dose of stubborn illusion.