Arendt and Adorno: Political and Philosophical Investigations

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Lars Rensmann and Samir Gandesha (eds.), Arendt and Adorno: Political and Philosophical Investigations, Stanford University Press, 2012, 368pp., $24.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780804775403.

Reviewed by Peg Birmingham, DePaul University


No two names better recall the political events of mid-twentieth century Germany or the philosophical attempts to respond to them than Arendt and Adorno. Yet, over the past several decades discussion of the relationship between them has focused primarily on their personal animosity. Well known is Arendt's remark regarding Adorno: "Der kommt uns nicht ins Haus!" ("That one's not coming into our house.") Not only did she hold Adorno responsible for her husband's failure to receive his Habilitationsschrift at the University of Frankfurt in 1930, she also blamed him for Benjamin's death, claiming that had he invited Benjamin to join the Institute for Social Research in Frankfurt, his suicide at the Spanish border would have been averted. Certainly Adorno felt nothing but aversion toward Arendt, although he was better able to mask his dislike. Arendt and Adorno: Political and Philosophical Investigations is a long overdue and much needed volume that takes the gaze off the personal relationship and focuses instead on the many theoretical affinities between the two thinkers, specifically their shared debt to Benjamin's thought, their shared history of anti-Semitism, their shared experience of homelessness and exile in the wake of totalitarianism, and their shared interest in aesthetics as offering a way to rethink the political.

Among the several essays connecting Arendt and Adorno through their shared interest in Benjamin's thought, Seyla Benhabib's "Arendt and Adorno: The Elusiveness of the Particular and the Benjaminian Moment," stands out. She begins with a striking image of Arendt and Benjamin, exiled in Paris, playing chess. While Benhabib notes the personal animosity between them, both she argues, "shared a profound sense that one must learn to 'think anew,' beyond the traditional schools of philosophy and methodology" (33). She calls this shared moment of thinking anew the "Benjaminian moment," defining it as the shared commitment to face "the elusiveness of the particular" against "false universals" (34). Working her way through each thinker's relation to Heidegger, Kant, and Hegel, Benhabib shows that the major difference between Arendt and Adorno lies in how each takes up the aesthetic as a way to think the particular. In a very complex and detailed discussion, Benhabib criticizes Benjamin's affirmation of a "natural beauty as a cipher for nature," arguing that it remains a philosophical concept that can be only be intimated. Arendt, she argues, turns to aesthetic judgment, linking it to narrative and the insistence that "our experience be communicative and shared with others" (54). She suggests without quite saying it that of the two, only Arendt offers a political theory.

Jay Bernstein ("Political Modernism: The New Revolution and Civil Disobedience in Arendt and Adorno") makes explicit what Benhabib's essay only suggests, namely, that "Adorno never managed to translate the promises borne by artistic practices into political praxis" (57). His thesis is that "after numerous detours and false starts, Hannah Arendt's political theory can be read as accomplishing the translation of artistic practice into political praxis; in her writings modernism for the first time takes on a systematic political visage" (57). Indeed, he goes on to say that if Adorno's thought is characterized by a defense of artistic modernism, then the question that links Adorno's thought to Arendt's is "what might political modernism be?" (58) Bernstein answers by claiming that Arendt's political philosophy "is the closest approximation to a critical political philosophy matching the modernist program of first general critical theory to have appeared" (58) Arendt's great accomplishment, he argues, is to take the concept of the new that animates modernism's experimentalism and find it in political action which she defines as the capacity of beginning anew. The rest of his essay gives a detailed defense of this claim, looking at the ways revolution and civil disobedience are at work in Arendt's political thought. Indeed, he offers the reader an original and fascinating insight, namely, that Arendt's conception of the civil disobedience "operates politically in a manner deeply analogous to the way in which Adornian negative dialectics proceeds theoretically" (59). After a long and fruitful analysis of Arendt's concept of revolution, Bernstein returns to Adorno specifically and the Left generally arguing that both have failed to see that Arendt's concept of civil disobedience "empirically anchors Adorno's binding of negation and praxis" (75). His essay concludes by rethinking in a very productive way the utopian moment in each's thinking.

Dana Villa's "From the Critique of Identity to Plurality in Politics: Reconsidering Adorno and Arendt," also questions the political reach of Adorno's work. In a very nuanced and complex reading of Adorno, Villa writes, "But, we must ask, is this in any way a political project, and can Negative Dialectics and the critique of identity philosophy be viewed as a form of political theory?" (92) Villa answers with a resounding "no," citing Wellmer: "'Adorno did not have a political theory -- he had a dream'" (90). The problem for Villa is that Adorno's thought is rooted in a "logic of disintegration" in which politics is precisely the attempt to "constrain difference" (95). Therefore Adorno's thought can only exist beyond politics, in a "difference-affirming utopia" (95). This leads Villa to Arendt who, he argues, understands that beyond utopia and difference is the public realm with its plurality of actors whose activity requires enduring public institutions. According to Villa, Adorno is unable to see political institutions as anything other than "the concrete instantiations of a steam-rolling and difference-effacing Universal" (103). Arendt, on the other hand, views "individual and political rights as . . . worldly creations in need of institutional articulation and vigilant citizen protection and oversight" (103).

Dieter Thomä's "Passion Lost, Passion Regained: How Arendt's Anthropology Intersects with Adorno's Theory of the Subject," rounds out the first part of the volume. Thomä is interested in how Arendt's Amour Mundi, the title initially proposed for what became The Human Condition, squares with her claims that love is essentially worldless. How can love be a worldly activity? It is unclear whether the problem is as great as Thomä claims, and certainly it is far from clear how it all relates to Adorno. Neither Arendt nor Adorno make love central to their political and philosophical thinking. Trying to link these two thinkers together through a concept that neither embraces is misguided and reveals a serious shortcoming of the constructivist approach.

The second part of the volume focuses on Arendt's and Adorno's shared legacy of totalitarianism, anti-Semitism, and the status of "crimes against humanities." Rensmann's "Grounding Cosmpolitics: Rethinking Crimes Against Humanity and Global Political Theory with Arendt and Adorno," is one of the best essays in the collection, showing how the legacy of the holocaust gives rise to a universal political imperative, namely, to prevent crimes against humanity. Although Rensmann gives a detailed account of how this universal imperative is at work in the two thinkers, he goes far beyond Arendt and Adorno in outlining the aporias of human rights international law while at the same time showing their possibilities.

Robert Fine's "Debating Human Rights, Law, and Subjectivity: Arendt, Adorno, and Critical Theory," argues that a distinction must be made between a critique of rights and what he calls "the thrashing of rights." He argues that both Arendt and Adorno, while critical of human rights, never abandon "their belief in the value of rights and critique" (170). Against Villa's reading, Fine argues that Adorno, like Arendt, understands the important role juridical institutions play in the political instantiation of human rights and the disasters that occur when these institutions are "declared invalid, overridden from above, or undermined from below" (156). Fine also reveals the dangers of a constructive account in which each account gets short shrift. He ultimately abandons both, suggesting instead that to engage the question of right and law we need "to rediscover Kant and Hegel" (170).

Jonathan Judaken's "Blindness and Insight: The Conceptual Jew in Adorno and Arendt's Post-Holocaust Reflections on the Antisemitic Question," looks at the concept of the Jew that emerges in each of their accounts of the history of anti-Semitism. Judaken is especially critical of Arendt's account of what is for him primarily an economic interpretation of the Jews' place in the state. This is a very important essay, raising the problem of what Judaken calls the "conceptual Jew." He asks "how one fills the content of the conceptual Jew is reworked as both at the origins and the ends of their speculative reflections on modernity" (196). He argues that both Arendt and Adorno understand the conceptual Jew as "a figure of difference, a cipher for the outsider, the queer, the nomad" and at the same time "too closely identified with financial capitalism and the underside of modernity" (196). Judaken's essay is provocative in suggesting that it is impossible to pry apart the conceptual Jew from the history of anti-Semitism.

Wessel and Rensmann ("The Paralysis of Judgment: Arendt and Adorno on Antisemitism and the Modern Condition") find promise in Adorno's view of the authoritative character as exemplifying the late modern capitalist subject, ripe for totalitarianism. This essay is rambling and does not go further than what has been described at length regarding the modern world: its isolation and atomization, the loss of experience, the breakdown of thought. But this alone does not seem to get at what specifically happened. If this is the state of modern society, why did it happen in Germany? Why the Jews?

The third and final part of the volume addresses the ways in which the experience of exile serves as a theoretical framework for both thinkers. Dirk Auer's, "Theorists in Exile: Adorno's and Arendt's reflections on the Place of the Intellectual," explores how each thinker theorized "the simultaneity of intellectual activity, on the one hand, and social negation and displacement, on the other?" (229) He convincingly shows that both Arendt's and Adorno's understanding of a "fragmented history" emerges from the experience of exile. At the same, Auer is all too aware that the emphasis on exile as an intellectual framework "ignores the concrete experiences of displacement and its concomitant suffering." Auer does not valorize the condition of exile, citing Edward Said's noted difference between the "optimistic mobility" of the postmodern intellectual nomads and the "massive dislocations, waste, misery, and horrors enduring in our century's migrations and mutilated lives," (278). Indeed he argues that Arendt and Adorno were well aware of the dangers of such valorization, which is why both insisted that exile be connected to a common world. In other words, Auer makes a claim very similar to the one made by Villa, namely, political theorists cannot afford to make absolute the principle of difference insofar as it would render impossible political solidarity. As Villa points out in his essay, the political is the realm in which boundaries are drawn around difference and so allow for human plurality in which, to use Adorno's words, we can be "different without fear." Unlike Villa, however, Auer suggests that Adorno's principle of difference is not absolute and hence his thought does allow for a new political theory.

How to draw these boundaries without lapsing again into an exclusionary politics is Samir Gandesha's subject in "Homeless Philosophy: The Exile of Philosophy and the Philosophy of Exile in Arendt and Adorno." He challenges the secondary literature on both Arendt and Adorno, including some of the essays in this volume, that Arendt is the sober-minded thinker of actual politics while Adorno is the thinker of the closure of the political space. Implicitly arguing against Villa's claims, Gandesha argues that Adorno never gave up on politics. He also claims that Arendt was much more interested in rethinking the political through reflections on art, culture, and literature than she is in putting forth a "real politics." Indeed, he argues that for both thinkers, it is the intersection of the "requirements of art" with the "requirements of democratic politics," that provides "the basis for an answer to the question of their contemporary relevance" (248). Like so many in this volume, he shows the link between a certain conception of history as process and the event of totalitarianism, a connection that for both Arendt and Adorno was made impossible by the experience of exile.

Gandesha, like so many of the other contributors, emphasizes the central place aesthetic judgment held for both thinkers in their attempts to think novelty in the wake of totalitarianism's attempt to reduce everything to the same. How to bear the shock of the new, how to judge the singular in its singularity? Gandesha is not shy to criticize Arendt's aesthetic turn, requiring as it does the sensus communis and the enlarged mentality. Paradoxically, aesthetic judgment for Arendt demands the sensus communis, yet this is the very thing that aesthetic judgment is called in to re-establish. Gandesha sees more possibilities in Adorno's turn to the aesthetic, specifically his reflections on writing which "pushes the tension between communication and expression to its limits" and thereby allows for those "moments sacrificed by the concept to appear" (278). This leads Adorno to another paradox, namely, that "aesthetic experience . . . can only take up its political vocation by jealously guarding its own autonomy from politics" (278). Rather than criticizing Adorno for lacking a political theory, Gandesha claims that "it becomes possible to recognize in Adorno, not so much a critical theory erected upon shaky normative foundations, as an account of the withdrawal of the political in modernity, which can only be addressed negatively" (278).

Although some of the essays in this volume seem to construct artificial connections between the two thinkers, on the whole they offer a very rich and nuanced understanding of the convergences and divergences between Adorno's and Arendt's thought. If there is a single question that animates many of them it is whether a politics of "difference without fear" (Adorno) or a non-sacrificial politics of plurality (Arendt) is possible. As Gandesha concludes, while Adorno understands that the experience of home is always defined by its other, Arendt understands that the experience of homelessness makes it important that human beings have the 'right to have rights,' and herein lies the political problem that both Arendt and Adorno grappled with their entire lives: "membership in community, any community, necessitates and cannot avoid completely the sacrificial logic of identity." (279)