Arendt, Augustine, and the New Beginning: The Action Theory and Moral Thought of Hannah Arendt in the Light of Her Dissertation on St. Augustine

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Stephan Kampowski, Arendt, Augustine, and the New Beginning: The Action Theory and Moral Thought of Hannah Arendt in the Light of Her Dissertation on St. Augustine, Eerdmans, 2008, 364pp., $50.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780802827241.

Reviewed by Elizabeth Minnich, Association of American Colleges and Universities



Karl Jaspers, Hannah Arendt’s dissertation supervisor and life-long thinking friend, wrote in The Great Philosophers: “What we call their doctrine permeated their lives … We enter into thinking with them” in order to “feel the heartbeat of philosophy. Reduced to disembodied principles, their thought dries out and ceases to be anything more than a collection of samples in the herbarium of philosophical concepts.” (p. xi)

I. To begin, there is the question of how, of approach, attitude, method

Saint Augustine’s significance for Hannah Arendt — a modern, apparently secular Jewish woman who took as given the irreversibility of “modern ‘deaths’ — of God, metaphysics, philosophy.” (Life of The Mind, p. 11) — is an obviously tantalizing question. On the face of it, these two thinkers would seem at best incompatible. In this superb book, Stephan Kampowski takes up this challenging inquiry, following a winding trail through Arendt’s life as it is intriguingly marked, both early and late in her work, by her citations of Augustine. Kampowski’s quest turns out to illuminate the whole of Hannah Arendt’s, and strands of Augustine’s, thought afresh. It does so in good measure because of his approach, on which I will therefore spend more than the usual time.

Kampowski neither forces either of these distinctive thinkers into the other’s terms nor stops when he has located divergences. Instead, as Arendt’s dissertation supervisor, Karl Jaspers, put it, he seeks “the heartbeat” of their philosophizing below and beyond tangles, by-ways, contradictions as well as similarities. To thus reflect on Augustine and Arendt as they cast light on each other is to remember and take seriously the fact that, however different their paths, both sought meaning to sustain lives in “dark times,” as the title of one of Arendt’s books has it. Augustine and Arendt’s works, Kampowski observes,

share a fundamental concern: both are exercises in what may be called phenomenological Existenz philosophy … The Augustine book is … about how a Christian … can be both in the world — because he is to love his neighbor — and not of the world — because he has the grounds of his existence in God (p. 4).

Similarly, Kampowski observes, Arendt’s biography of Rahel Varnhagen, to cite a key example, "presents Jewish existence in the European Christian world as analogous to the way Augustine conceives Christian existence in the secular world … in the world, but not of it … between pariah and parvenue" (p. 4). Kampowski’s focus on Arendt’s dissertation as it inquires into Augustine’s “question about the neighbor’s relevance for the believer who is estranged from the world and its desires.” This is a question that entails “the question of what it means to love God and oneself” and thus becomes of more than academic interest to Arendt specialists (Love and Saint Augustine, p. 3). In their differing ways and times, Augustine and Arendt inquired into the need for something beyond our merely subjective selves that without contradiction enables individual and collective freedom, thence action, responsibility and moral concerns.

Reading for meanings, not logic, Kampowski moves easily through arguments over whether or how Arendt’s early philosophizing in her dissertation is determining or irrelevant, and/or whether her thought is adequately systematic or consistent. He does the same with debates about whether she adequately provides definitions and theories of action, of ethics. Eschewing dueling dilemmas here too, he writes, "But in our opinion it is possible to understand ‘theory’ also as an open systematization of thought, which occurs, for instance, already the moment we make distinctions," a generous — and realistic — move that, in ethics as in action, allows us to approach a “much larger field, in which the questions that Arendt” — as well as Augustine — “posed and sought to answer … have a rightful and central place” (p. xix).

Facing charges against Augustine similar to those later brought against her, Arendt wrote, in the Introduction to her dissertation:

The illumination of incongruities is not tantamount to the solution of problems arising from a relatively closed conceptual and empirical context … We must let the contradictions stand as what they are, make them understood as contradictions, and grasp what lies beneath them (Arendt, op cit., p.7).

This is the deep questioning of Existenz philosophizing as Jaspers practiced it, and it is akin to Heidegger’s insistence that thinking, as distinct from science, is always out of order. Kampowski harmonizes his approach with theirs:

Arendt’s thought often wanders off onto side roads not always properly marked as such, so that the question of placing the right emphases is of utmost importance if we want to understand her writings correctly. If there are pervading themes that are present in her writings from beginning to end, these deserve to be highlighted … [to help in] searching for certain fundamental elements of Arendt’s thought (p. xvii-xviii).

Again, it is worthy of note that Arendt’s interest in action, through which we appear to others, is honored in practice by Kampowski’s approach. Since Arendt has been very controversial, Kampowski’s care to let her appear, to think with and not only about her, is a tribute to his integrity as a scholar. He also models another of Arendt’s thinking friends, Kant, on whose “maxim of common human understanding” concerning “enlarged thought” (in her version, “Thinking in the place of others”) she often drew. As a young scholar, Arendt brought to Augustine just such recognition, a rare gift in any times.

It is thus a democratic as well as philosophical approach to which Kampowski draws attention when he says that his “general approach to Arendt” is to try “to give her as benevolent a reading as reasonably possible” (p. 196). How else, as Jaspers taught, ought we rise to meeting philosophers, and philosophy? Illumination is far more than a turn of speech for Augustine — and the same is true for Jaspers, Heidegger, Kant, Arendt, and Kampowski. This book’s subtitle — The Action Theory and Moral Thought of Hannah Arendt in the Light of Her Dissertation on St. Augustine — is, as such things rarely are, precisely apt and richly suggestive.

II. New beginnings: natality, creating, Creation

Kampowski presents his study of Augustine, Arendt and “the New Beginning” in five “major steps,” following recurrences of her citation of Augustine’s "Initium ergo ut esset, creatus est homo, ante quem nullus fuit" (in Arendt translated as, “That there be a beginning, man was created before whom there was nobody”) (p. 46). Hardly surprisingly, given Kampowski’s approach, biography and bibliography lead off, because “When dealing with action theory or issues relating to moral philosophy, we are discussing things relating to concrete life-situations, and these concrete life-situations will in turn influence thought” (p. xx). He picks out for mention Arendt’s relation with Heidegger (which “disappointed” and “hurt” her); the Holocaust, and her own subsequent statelessness as an émigré; and her work as a “controversial” journalist and then a “respectable professor” (p. xx). One can hardly argue that these were not important for Arendt and so in some ways for her work, although I will note that it is odd how many people point out her painful relation with Heidegger while barely recognizing her enduring friendship with Jaspers and her long marriage to Heinrich Blucher, or, for that matter, her insistence on keeping her own name, and remaining “unrespectable” (as she wrote to Jaspers). Fortunately, Kampowski treats life events as he does questions of Augustine’s influence: he seeks to illuminate, neither to reduce nor explain. It is important that his bibliographic discussion is included in the same “step.” He takes care to announce that he centers his analysis "of Arendt’s thought on action around The Human Condition, of ethics, on The Life of the Mind“(p. xx).

”NDPRBodyTexT0">His second “step” takes care of scholarly business: he tells us that Arendt’s dissertation as edited and published in 1992 by Scott and Stark renders “very difficult the English reader’s proper access to Arendt’s original 1929 dissertation” (p. xx). His own reading moves between the editors’ “interpretive essay” — which took this early work to be, in Kampowski’s reading of their claim, “that people unfamiliar with Arendt’s dissertation cannot completely understand her thought” — and “most Arendtian scholars,” including many who have not worked on Der Liebesbegriff bei Augustin in any language and whom Kampowski will not discredit on that count alone (p. xvii). What matters for a reading such as Kampowski’s, though, is that Arendt began her work with Augustine in mind, and, strikingly, "ends it with her perhaps most philosophical work, The Life of the Mind, in which Augustine again plays a pivotal role" (p. xviii). This leads him to agree with Remo Bodei’s acute observation that, “The span of [Arendt’s] reflection is thus symbolically brought together under the sign of Augustine” (p. xviii).

In his third and fourth “steps,” Kampowski focuses on action and on ethics, before circling back, (fifth step), to put "Arendt’s mature ideas on action and ethics in relation to her argument in her juvenile Der Liebesbegriff" (p. xx). Throughout, there is the drama of believers struggling to discern obligations to love neighbors as self in light of the love of a transcendent God, the quandary of faith that attracted Arendt’s political, moral interest. All is not smooth on the ways between Arendt and Augustine, of course. Kampowski points out that, “As the love of God … is nothing of the world, Arendt claims that Christian charity is worldless and therefore antipolitical” (p. 74). “However,” he responds, “St. Thomas, for instance, defines love in terms of ‘willing the good for someone.’ Here, ‘the good’ takes on the place of the [Arendtian] ‘in-between,’” and “because the world offers the goods by which the Christian can love God and his neighbor,” “action, as an activity that appears in the world, and politics, as the pursuit of acting people, are also of central importance for Christian morality” (Kampowski, p. 74). This is a bit convoluted. For one thing, “the good” is tricky to conceive of as a worldly “in-between”; we need conceptual translation, not just assertion, to make that work. “The good” as the inter-est of political actors is not the key to harmony Kampowski seeks.

Nor is the key Augustine’s A question I become for myself, another Augstinian statement to which Arendt often returned — along with the statement that is central to Kampowski’s study, "initium ergo ut esset, creatus est homo — ‘That a beginning be made, man was created’" (Arendt quoting Augustine’s “Civitas Dei”, lib. 12, cap. 20; Kampowski, p. 6). Kampowski rightly recognizes that it is difficult now to approach Arendt as well as Augustine on subjectivity in significant part because, “‘subjectivity’ is too easily identified with a person’s consciousness.” Arendt, “however, is quite aware that this problem cannot be solved within the framework in which it was posed.” Indeed,

For her, this turn to consciousness, one of the defining marks of modernity, is among the main reasons for what she called the modern-day world alienation and is even partly responsible for the widespread loss of religious faith in much of the Western world (p. 66).

Kampowski then reminds us that Arendt does not “start with individual consciousness but with the world that people hold in common,” with that same inter-est we have encountered, as it engages us and allows us to communicate meaningfully (p. 66-67). “Thus,” he writes, “to Arendt’s mind, intersubjectivity is mediated by the world and realized by common action” (p. 67). That is, modern hyper-individualized alienation does not force Arendt out of the world, away from possibility of moral love of neighbor, any more than love of God does for Augustine. Here is common — not the same, but sharable — ground.

What is really important for Kampowski is that Arendt found in Augustine support for her conception of natality, a given, as she pointed out in the face of a mortality-obsessed tradition, of the human condition. That we are creatures who are born — conceived, gestated, birthed — reminds us, of course, that relatedness rather than isolation can be claimed as our existential base. At some point much later than its original composition, Arendt added this notion, which Kampowski is not alone in considering perhaps her most original contribution, to her dissertation. "To put it differently," she wrote, “the decisive fact determining man as a conscious, remembering being is birth or ‘natality,’ that is, the fact that we have entered the world through birth” (p. 208, emphasis added by Kampowski).

Whether Arendt read meanings into Augustine or indeed found them there remains moot, as Kampowski carefully observes. What interests him, as always, is illuminating conjunction, and natality is a concept that did a lot of philosophical work for Arendt as she understood beginning to do for Augustine. Natality, beginning, creation in tension with mortality, with ends in several senses, including as limitations of freedom as of being: these are, shall we say, fertile concepts for both Arendt and Augustine.

Natality recognizes ongoing renewal not through mere replication or extension, but in the utter originality of each new being entering an ongoing world that then also enters her or him. As Kampowski can then say,

Freedom, therefore, is not so much a theory about human dispositions — essentially beset by riddles — but rather a fundamental fact of the human condition. Insofar as men are born, they are new beginnings. Insofar as they are new beginnings, they can make new beginnings. (p. 170)

Here, however, Kampowski has also to deal with Arendt’s distinction between making and acting, such that acting remains free even of ends while making, even as creating, something does not. Since key to his effort to illuminate Arendt in relation to Augustine, and action in relation to morality, is the connection he finds between natality and creation, thence also Creation by God, this — more than his concern over Arendt’s downplaying of emotion in relation to morality — could have derailed Kampowski’s exploration.

However, reading as he does below contradictions, in preparation for his Conclusion, he writes:

Arendt, it would seem quite legitimately, introduced her notion of natality [into her revised dissertation] precisely at the place where decades earlier she had talked about the creature’s dependence on his Creator. Natality and createdness are closely related in that both imply gratuitous existence and novelty. Birth is the manifestation of a newcomer into the world … There was nothing necessary about his coming … The very idea of createdness, in turn, is that one owes one’s being to another. But it also bespeaks novelty. We remember that the idea of divine creation served Arendt as one of the best paradigms for the new beginning (p. 208-209).

Here is the “New Beginning” of Kampowski’s title — Arendt’s natality as human beginning “illuminated” by and “harmonized” with Augustine’s faith in creation.

Kampowski arrives at this mutually illuminating, non-reductive understanding:

We have tried to show that the notion of createdness — of having one’s origin in one’s Creator — and of natality are corresponding ideas. The Christian believer of Arendt’s dissertation, who is at peace with his origin in the Creator, resembles the person who can accept his natality and consider his life and all the conditions under which it is given as a free grace to be grateful for, a gift on the basis of which he is able to introduce his own free initiatives. (p. 228-229)

Threading key points together, Kampowski quotes Arendt:

The decisive fact determining man as a conscious, remembering being is birth or ‘natality,’ that is, the fact that we have entered the world through birth. The decisive fact determining man as a desiring being was death or mortality, the fact that we shall leave the world in death. Fear of death and inadequacy of life are the springs of desire. In contrast, gratitude for life having been given at all is the spring of remembrance. (quoted on p. 221-22)

Fear and desire, gratitude and remembrance: these, rather than solely their grounding in the “decisive fact[s]” of our natality and mortality are what matter to those asking how we are to relate to ourselves, others, our lives, and the world in which after all we must seek to be good. Augustine asked how we should live; so, too, did Arendt. Kampowski has done us the favor of inviting us into their overlapping, distinct, circles of light to see for ourselves, with them. That we join in trying to do so matters now, as always:

Natality, which is the very basis of man’s capacity to act and to start something new, is intimately related to remembrance. Remembrance, in turn, is related to gratitude, the only alternative to the resentment that caused the total moral collapse we witnessed in the totalitarian systems of the mid-twentieth century in Germany and Russia (p. 222).