Arendt on the Political

Placeholder book cover

David Arndt, Arendt on the Political, Cambridge University Press, 2019, 282pp., $99.99 (hbk), ISBN 9781108498319.

Reviewed by Shmuel Lederman, Weiss-Livnat Center for Holocaust Research and Education at the University of Haifa


David Arndt's book is an excellent exposition of Arendt's political thought. Anyone interested in Arendt would benefit from the clear presentation and analysis of the main concepts and ideas Arendt thought through in her writings; the careful distinctions he offers between the meanings Arendt gave to these concepts and the more common understanding of them; and the useful theoretical and historical background by which Arndt contextualizes Arendt's contributions to political theory. In particular, Arndt's emphasis on the importance of what he calls Arendt's "pure" concept of the political, namely the way she explored the meaning of politics as a unique human activity, distinct from any other human experience, illuminates how Arendt thought about the meaning of the political like few other political thinkers in the 20th century did.

Arndt justly elaborates in his study on the need to glean from Arendt's writings both her distinctive understanding of the political and the way she approached political theory, as she never explicated clearly these central aspects of her political thought. It is perhaps Arndt's greatest contribution that he manages to analyze and explain the way Arendt thought about the political and her phenomenological method in an exceptionally clear manner. To the extent that one important aim of Arndt's book was to make Arendt's work "accessible to citizens and strangers alike," as he puts it in the preface (viii), one can only admire his ability to do so.

While the first chapter is mostly an introduction to Arendt's life and thought, the second chapter, which focuses on Arendt's approach to political theory, is particularly interesting. Arndt stresses the extent to which Arendt relied on "nontheoretical" sources -- histories, dramas, poetry, political writings, etc. -- to introduce her core insights into the experience of the political and to challenge the way central concepts like politics, power and freedom have been understood in the tradition of political thought (38-42). One may add that the very method of turning to "nontheoretical" sources at least hints at the democratic potential of Arendt's work. It points to her belief that opinions, including those of "ordinary" people, hold an important aspect of truth about our shared world even if they are always partial and often prejudiced. In Arndt's words: "Nontheoretical discourse is not just a crude or primitive form of language, rife with prejudice and confusion . . . Instead, nontheoretical discourse may articulate genuine insights reached through nontheoretical forms of thought" (40).

Thus, the task of the political theorist is not to transcend opinions in order to find the truth beyond them (as Leo Strauss, for example, would have it), but to engage with the different perspectives on the world those opinions represent, in order to get to a fuller grasp of the common world -- and to help establish a political community in which such exchange of perspective becomes part of the political structure (67-70; 86-88). This is, in fact, much of what politics is about, but in order to rethink politics in these terms one has to challenge common prejudices about this human activity, such as that politics is a means to an end; that politics is a matter of rule and constitutes a struggle for the power to rule; and that politics is a universal and necessary part of human life rather than a distinct human activity that has to be carefully differentiated from others and has been experienced rather rarely in human history (48-49).

Arndt makes much of Arendt's attempt to retrieve an authentic understanding of freedom articulated in the texts of classical antiquity -- "not in the theories of philosophers . . . but in the nontheoretical discourse of 'political and pre-philosophical traditions'" (42). It is hard to exaggerate the importance of this attempt by Arendt. It allowed her to offer a concept of freedom significantly different from the ones familiar in the tradition of political thought. Arendt is often identified with the republican tradition, but her insistence that freedom is not something we have, but rather an experience we enjoy only while acting and speaking with our fellow citizens in the public sphere, makes her concept of freedom not only "positive" in nature rather than "negative," as in the liberal tradition (140-148); but also far more radical than the one typically expounded by republican thinkers. Among other issues, it makes active participation in politics necessary for anyone who wishes to experience freedom, and thus calls for a radical democratic politics in which every citizen would have the space and opportunity to participate in decision-making. The attention Arndt pays to the kind of sources Arendt drew on enables the reader to understand the extent to which Arendt was engaged in a battle against the dominant conceptions of the meaning of politics and freedom that have been passed down in the Western tradition of political thought since Plato and Aristotle, many of which are actually anti-political in essence, in the sense that they expressed the philosopher's prejudices and hostility towards politics (chap. 5; 6). What was bound to emerge from it was a truly radical alternative conception of the political.

When Arendt turns to the Greek polis in The Human Condition and other writings, then, her intention was not to romantically idealize the polis but rather, as Arndt puts it, "to grasp the distinctive traits of the one exemplary political community -- classical Athens -- in order to clarify the nature and conditions of politics as such" (54). In other words, it was in order to arrive at a "pure concept of the political." Such a concept of the political, in Arndt's formulation, perceives politics as "a way of being together, based on the principles of equality and nonviolence, in which people decide what to do and how to live together through mutual persuasion and common deliberation on matters of public concern" (70). This is a fair statement of what could have been Arendt's definition of politics, although one suspects that she refrained from such formulations precisely because they remain too general to capture the unique experience of the political.

Another particularly interesting chapter in Arndt's study is chapter 7, in which he analyzes Arendt's discussion of the American Revolution. While most commentators tend to stress Arendt's celebration of this revolution and to contrast it with her much harsher judgment of the French Revolution, Arndt focuses on Arendt's claim that the legacy of the American Revolution has been forgotten. In particular, Arndt explicates Arendt's belief that the revolutionaries themselves failed to grasp the meaning of their own experiences, not only because the meaning of such actions is best captured by spectators such as historians, rather than the actors themselves; but also because they were misled by the influence of traditional political philosophy over their own thinking. Thus, since the revolutionaries "did not conceive of their experiences in terms that could fully grasp the meaning of events, they died without leaving behind a conceptual language that articulated and preserved their deepest insights" (192). This failure, according to Arendt, was not coincidental. It was directly related to the rift between philosophy and politics that was established in Western political thought by Plato following Socrates' execution. The result of this rift has been that philosophers have tended to think about politics from the point of view of the philosophical experience rather than that of action, and therefore failed to articulate the experiences of political actors; whereas actors have been limited in their ability to articulate their own experiences because of the often distorting conceptual language that was available to them. The American Revolution was for Arendt one of the most tragic examples of how such failure to conceptualize the experience of the actors and to pass it on to contemporaries as well as to the next generations can lead to the loss of the innermost meanings of the political event (260-261).

Here too, Arendt tried to recover the revolutionary experience through the "nontheoretical" writings of the Founding Fathers (196). She emphasized, in particular, their discovery of the "public happiness" involved in political action and in the foundation of a new body politic based on freedom, namely a body politic in which they could participate as equals (209-210). But the gap between what they were experiencing and how they conceptualized it was one important reason why they failed to preserve the "revolutionary spirit," that is, to establish institutions where citizens could engage in political action and deliberation on a regular basis; or in more practical terms -- to incorporate the town hall meetings into the very structure of the new republic. It was the beginning of a process by which the American Republic came to be, in Arendt's view, an elected oligarchy rather than a genuinely democratic government (258-259).

Arndt shares this Arendtian sense of the persisting failure of the American Republic, and it seems that this is at least partly what motivated him to think with Arendt in this book about the state of politics in general and in the United States in particular. As is well-known, many political theorists as well as activists and "ordinary" citizens hold a similar view of the oligarchic nature of the United States, and at least some would see this oligarchy not only in terms of the rule of the wealthy but also in terms of political participation, namely, that whether by omission or by commission the United States denies citizens active participation in decision-making. But probably only a few would trace this failure back to the influence of the tradition of political thought and write, as Arndt does near the conclusion of his study, that this failure is

also evident in our thoughtless use of traditional concepts. We will not fully understand the meaning of American history until we critically dismantle the inherited terms in which we think: action, power, authority, law, principle, contract, government, citizenship, rights, equality, opinion, judgment, persuasion, rhetoric, consent, dissent, and freedom. Above all, we have to rethink inherited concepts of the political. (262)

At the very least, Arndt shows convincingly in his study that Arendt is still an extremely valuable companion to rethink these inherited concepts of the political.

Naturally, Arndt's book also has its limitations and weaknesses. It is often unclear what, beyond clarifying and contextualizing Arendt's main concepts and ideas, is new in Arndt's study. Arndt makes it hard to identify as he only occasionally places his interpretation of Arendt in relation to the interpretation of other scholars. Indeed, for the most part the reader feels he is in waters that have been charted quite extensively in the vast literature on Arendt.

Some of the more specific points made by Arndt would likely not be accepted by most scholars of Arendt. For example, according to his description, Arendt went to the Eichmann trial in Jerusalem "expecting Eichmann to be a terrible but extraordinary man -- a malevolent genius, a sadist, a monster. Instead she found him shockingly ordinary" (28). There is no evidence that Arendt ever expected Eichmann to be some kind of evil genius, and as scholars like Margaret Canovan and Richard Bernstein have noted, her descriptions of the Nazi perpetrators in earlier works like The Origins of Totalitarianism appear suspiciously close to her depictions of Eichmann's character in Eichmann in Jerusalem.[1] It is possible that Arndt was misled by Arendt's own contrast of Eichmann with Iago and Macbeth in Eichmann in Jerusalem or by her depictions of Nazi evil as "radical evil" in her earlier works, but these do not reflect the way she actually thought about perpetrators like Eichmann before she saw and heard him in person.

At the same time, Arndt seems to me to uncritically accept some problematic interpretations that came to be entrenched in the scholarship on Arendt. He writes, for example, that Eichmann's thoughtlessness, in which Arendt found the key to his "banality," was the "blind commitment of a true believer. His view of the world derived from Nazi slogans rather than from any authentic reflection on his own experience, or any real engagement with other perspectives" (28). Later on, Arndt writes that Arendt believed Eichmann was "fanatically committed to Nazism" (28-29). Yet Arendt insisted repeatedly, in Eichmann in Jerusalem and elsewhere, that Eichmann was no fanatical ideologue. Eichmann's case, she wrote in her famous report, "was obviously also no case of insane hatred of Jews, of fanatical anti-Semitism or indoctrination of any kind."[2] "If one reads the book carefully," she explained to her friend Mary McCarthy, "one sees that Eichmann was much less influenced by ideology than I assumed in the book on totalitarianism. The impact of ideology upon the individual may have been overrated by me."[3] "Ideology," she stresses in an interview from 1964, referring specifically to Eichmann and the kind of criminal he represents, "didn't play a very big role here. This seems to me the decisive factor."[4]

Why, in the face of such clear statements by Arendt, does Arndt argue to the contrary? It is likely that the answer lies in the influence of similar arguments made by some of Arendt's most prominent scholars -- likewise oddly in contrast to Arendt's explicit statements -- that a more careful reading of Arendt and particularly her unique understanding of the way ideology functions, shows that she did think of Eichmann as an indoctrinated Nazi fanatic.[5] It seems to me that such interpretations miss much of the meaning of Arendt's shift from "radical evil" to the "banality of evil," which lies precisely in her quite radical realization that commitment to ideology is not necessary in making "ordinary" people into mass killers.[6]

Another example is Arndt's treatment of the subject matters of politics in Arendt's political theory. According to Arndt, for Arendt the question what matters should be politicized and which should be considered outside of politics are not inherent in the concept of the political but rather differ across times and cultures: "Private matters can always be made public, and public matters can always be privatized, and the distinction between what is properly public and what is properly private is always open to political debate" (71-72). In the same vein, and contrary to the perception of many commentators, argues Arndt, Arendt did not mean to exclude economic and social questions from political deliberation and debate, at least not to the extent that these questions concern justice and the common good rather than technical and factual issues (77).

Here too, Arndt seems to be following a recent tendency in the scholarship on Arendt to claim, contrary to what a straightforward reading of her writings would suggest, that Arendt did not in fact mean to exclude social and economic issues from politics. For some commentators, it is not the content of the demands but rather the attitude they represent -- whether of narrow self-interest or a more broadly shared public or common interest -- that counted for Arendt; and thus that for her, "Engaging in politics does not mean abandoning economic or social issues; it means fighting for them in the name of principles, interests, values that have a generalizable basis, and that concern us as members of a collectivity."[7] For others, the important distinction for Arendt was not between certain "issues" but between care for "life" -- the processes of sustaining bodily needs -- and care for the world. Therefore, what should enter into the public sphere is not a question of a certain content which is supposedly suitable only to the political, but a certain orientation, a distinctive "mode of being with others manifest in action and speech."[8] Arndt's position seems to be closest to a recent argument by Gündoğdu, who has suggested that what is political and not political is "not given in advance; a socioeconomic problem such as poverty can be politicized, though such politicization requires mediatory practices that can represent the problem as a shared concern demanding concerted action."[9]

Such interpretations seem to me to fly in the face of much of what Arendt wrote about the need to keep economic and social questions for the most part outside of political deliberation because they concern the necessities of life, rather than freedom. If anything, the recent publication of more of Arendt's unpublished writings in the collection Thinking without a Bannister[10] only serves to demonstrate this point, as Arendt expands in some of these essays on an argument she most famously made in On Revolution: the extent to which much of the failure of the French Revolution should be attributed to the revolutionaries' concern with the "social question," namely, with the question of poverty. Arendt leaves no doubt that the revolutionaries genuinely cared for justice and for the common good, yet once this became their focus the revolution was bound to go astray, in terms of its ability to establish a government based on freedom and to refrain from mass violence and dictatorship. Deterministic and problematic as Arendt's analysis may seem to most of us, it should be admitted that this was Arendt's view. In this sense, Arndt's attempt to explicate Arendt's "pure concept of politics" turns out to evade important aspects of the actual "purity" of Arendt's conception of the political.

Ultimately, however, these are matters of interpretive disagreement rather than faults in the study itself. Without a doubt, Arndt's book is an important addition to the scholarly effort to draw insights from the political thought of Hannah Arendt, who has emerged in recent decades not only as one of the most important political thinkers of the 20th century, but as one who is crucial to make sense of, and perhaps even make a difference in, the political world of the 21st.


[1] Margaret Canovan, Hannah Arendt: A Reinterpretation of Her Political Thought. (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1992), 24; Richard J. Bernstein, Hannah Arendt and the Jewish Question(Cambridge, Massachusetts: The MIT Press, 1996), chap. 7.

[2] Hannah Arendt, Eichmann in Jerusalem: A Report on the Banality of Evil (New York: Penguin Books, 1994), 26.

[3] Arendt to McCarthy, September 20, 1963, in Between Friends: The Correspondence of Hannah Arendt and Mary McCarthy, 1949-1975, ed. Carol Brightman (New York: Harcourt Brace & Company, 1995), 148.

[4] Hannah Arendt, "Interview by Joachim Fest," in The Last Interview and Other Conversations (Brooklyn and London: Melville House Publishing, 2013), 44.

[5] See, for example, Seyla Benhabib, "Who’s on Trial, Eichmann or Arendt?" The New York Times, September 2, 2014, available at; Roger Berkowitz, "Did Eichmann Think?" The American Interest, September 7, 2014, available at

[6] See Shmuel Lederman, "The Radicalism of the Banality of Evil: Ideology and Political Conformity in Arendt," New German Critique 46(2): 197-220.

[7] Patricia Owens, "Not Life but the World is At Stake: Hannah Arendt on Citizenship in the Age of the Social," Citizenship Studies 16, no. 2 (2012): 298.

[8] Ibid., 306, emphasis in the original.

[9] Ayten Gündogdu, Rightlessness in an Age of Rights: Hannah Arendt and the Contemporary Struggles of Migrants (New York: Oxford University Press, 2015), 69.

[10] Hannah Arendt, Thinking Without a Banister, ed. Jerome Kohn (New York: Schocken Books, 2018).