Arguing about Gods

Placeholder book cover

Graham Oppy, Arguing about Gods, Cambridge University Press, 2006, 472pp., $90.00 (hbk), ISBN 0521863864.

Reviewed by Alexander R. Pruss, Georgetown University


Graham Oppy's Arguing about Gods is the most comprehensive available critical philosophical examination of arguments for the existence of "an orthodoxly conceived monotheistic god" (a phrase that occurs often in the book, and which I shall abbreviate as "God").  Oppy argues that there are no successful arguments for the existence or non-existence of God.  Reasonable people can be agnostics, or theists, or, like Oppy himself, atheists. 

Oppy openly states that he has no transcendental argument against the existence of an argument for the existence of God.  Rather, his approach is to examine every at all plausible kind of argument offered for the existence of God, and to argue that none of them succeeds.  He also examines the argument from evil and argues that neither it nor the sceptical theist response is successful.

I will begin by critically discussing Oppy's general project and then make some remarks on the specifics.  Central to the project is the notion of a successful argument.  As far as I can tell, Oppy never gives a precise definition of this, but his starting point is the observation:

The most successful argument would be one that succeeds -- or perhaps would or ought to succeed -- in persuading any reasonable person to accept its conclusion; good, but less successful arguments would be ones that succeed -- or perhaps would or ought to succeed -- in persuading a non-zero percentage of reasonable people to accept their conclusions. (p. 10)

Moreover, a sufficient condition for an argument's being "a failure" is that the person to whom it is addressed does not accept the premises (p. 12).  Oppy's strategy, then, is to examine arguments for and against the existence of God and try to identify in each at least one -- typically more than one -- premise that an opponent will reject.  Sometimes, Oppy gives a positive argument against the premise but sometimes he points out that it depends on controversial philosophical theses or that it is unclear that the premise is true.   Moreover, in the case of at least some arguments, Oppy believes that it is possible for a theist to reasonably take the argument to be sound (p. 34)

At this point a caution is needed.  For unless one has shown that a premise is actually false or has offered a transcendental argument that the premise goes beyond what is knowable it seems one has not shown that the premise can be reasonably rejected.  For suppose that Plantinga's reformed epistemology is correct and a proposition p is properly basic.  Then, assuming there are no undefeated defeaters, it is rational to accept p.  But it may well also be the case that it is irrational to reject p.  For p is an undefeated deliverance of a correctly functioning truth-directed doxastic faculty.  To fail to accept p absent a defeater is to neglect the undefeated deliverance of a correctly functioning truth-directed doxastic faculty, and this appears to be contrary to rationality.  Moreover, if it is the case that a correctly functioning truth-directed human doxastic faculty would deliver to one the claim that p, and yet one's own doxastic faculties do not deliver p to one, then one's doxastic faculties are failing to function correctly.  And unless the doxastic faculties in question are sensory, such a failure of doxastic faculties would seem to be a failure of rationality, though of course it could be one for which one is not culpable.

Hence, if something like this story is correct, to show that p can be reasonably rejected one must show that p is not a proposition that correctly functioning truth-directed non-sensory human doxastic faculties would deliver to one.   In particular, one would need to show that the rejection of p would not be epistemically perverse.  It might, for instance, be epistemically perverse to deny what appear to be self-evident principles such as that every contingent event has a cause or that p or not p.  It is certainly not enough to show that some apparently reasonable people in fact reject p, for their rejection of p might come from, say, indoctrination in childhood or graduate school, and such indoctrination is compatible with a fair amount of rationality being exhibited in one's subsequent belief change behavior (cf. p. 406).

A second global difficulty is Oppy's dismissal of cumulative case arguments for theism.  Oppy proceeds as if having shown each argument to be unsuccessful shows the aggregate of the arguments to be unsuccessful.  But that is incorrect.  For from the claim that for each argument in a collection there is a reasonable person x and a premise p that x could reject, it does not follow that there is a reasonable person x such that for every argument in the collection there is a premise p that x could reject (∀axp F(a,x,p) does not entail ∃xap F(a,x,p)).  An argument would be needed that the grounds of rejection of the premises are compatible with each other.  Moreover, it may be that although for each of ten arguments I can identify a premise or conjunction of premises that I assign a low probability to, I nonetheless would or even should assign a high probability to the disjunction of the controversial premises or conjunctions of premises.  It would be easy to list a dozen philosophical doctrines each of which I reject in the sense of assigning it a low probability (say, 10%).  Nonetheless, unless my rejection of each is on similar grounds, the disjunction of these doctrines may well have a moderately high probability, and I may well have good reason to accept doctrines that follow from their disjunction.

Oppy believes, however, that cumulative case arguments should be replaced by an examination in the light of the total evidence.  However, it seems clear that for the purposes of analysis it is helpful to subdivide the evidence into the evidence for and the evidence against a proposition, and thus to consider the cumulative case for a proposition and the cumulative case against a proposition.

A different response available to Oppy is to model credences on ranges of probabilities.  In his discussion of Pascal's Wager, Oppy considers the option that if "one is not prepared to rule out the possibility that it is a priori false" that God exists, then one will assign an interval of the form [0, a] to one's credence in theism.  Now if one's initial credence in theism is a range that includes 0, then no matter what probabilistic evidence comes in, one's credence will be an interval of the form [0, a] or [0, a), i.e., an interval including zero.  But one only counts as accepting a proposition if the credence is an interval both of whose bounds are greater than 1/2.  Hence, one will never accept theism on probabilistic grounds.  

However, it is not rational to assign to theism a credence interval containing zero, unless one actually has a valid deductive argument for the non-existence of God from indisputable empirical observations and/or from self-evident truths, and Oppy has not given us any evidence to think he has such an argument.  For let E be the following event: the skies brighten, everyone's computer screen flashes the words "I am God: listen to my revelation" in colors beyond the chromatic range of one's monitor, each mathematician finds a gold-edged piece of paper (the gold turns out to have no impurities at all and no impurities can be introduced) with a correct solution to a difficult open problem, signed "God", every turned-on Geiger counter has a gold-edged piece of paper on it listing, in very small print and with 20 digit precision, the exact time of every click over the next 48 hours, signed "God", all those with any physical ailments or abnormalities find these ailments and abnormalities gone, and instead find themselves holding a gold-edged piece of paper saying: "I wish I could have done this earlier, but I could not reasonably do so due to reasons you would not understand -- God".  Barring a deductive argument against the existence of God from indisputable premises, the occurrence of E should rationally make one believe in God.  But if one initially assigns a credence interval containing zero to the existence of God, then (this is a theorem) no evidence whose probability is greater than zero on the no-God hypothesis can in a Bayesian way raise the credence to an interval that does not contain zero.  But the probability of E is greater than zero given indeterministic quantum physics -- E could occur out of purely naturalistic causes.  Hence, assigning a credence interval containing zero to the existence of God is irrational as it makes it impossible to respond as one rationally ought to possible evidence such as E.

Thus, Oppy's overall project fails because (a) he has not shown that every theistic argument contains a premise that can be rejected without doxastic perversity, (b) he has not shown that there is an individual who is justified in rejecting the controversial premises of each theistic argument, and (c) Oppy does not adequately handle cumulative case arguments.  However, just as few of us are interested in Tolstoy's anti-individualistic philosophy of history that forms the central point of War and Peace but we can profit much from the novel on a finer grained level, so too there is much of value in Oppy's analysis of particular arguments.

Indeed, Oppy's examination of arguments for the existence of God is amazingly comprehensive.  In addition to the classical big guns -- the ontological, cosmological and teleological arguments -- Oppy includes, for instance, arguments from miracles, religious experience, consciousness, morality and beauty. 

The discussion of ontological arguments presupposes Oppy's magisterial Ontological Arguments and Belief in God[1], without which the goal of showing every theistic argument to be a failure has not been accomplished.  Nonetheless, in the book under review Oppy advances the discussion with an elegant rendering of Anselm's argument that both makes the argument unsound and explains how Anselm might have been confused. 

On the side of cosmological argument, we begin with a substandard discussion of the first three Ways in Aquinas.  Oppy accuses Aquinas of giving invalid arguments since the arguments clearly fail to establish the uniqueness of the First Cause (pp. 99, 103, 106).  The accusation is ludicrous since Aquinas cannot be intending to establish uniqueness in Question 2 (the Five Ways) of the Prima Pars of the Summa Theologiae as he explicitly devotes Question 11 to arguing for uniqueness, and Oppy never considers the arguments of Question 11.  On p. 101, Oppy speculates about how Aquinas might rule out the possibility of an endless regress of movers, apparently unaware of Aquinas' giving three explicit arguments in the Summa Contra Gentiles, I, 13.  In fact, Oppy in general seems quite unaware of the fact that the arguments in the Summa Theologiae are mere summaries, and extended subarguments for the main premises of the Five Ways are given elsewhere.  Nor is any use made of the distinction between per se and per accidens series which appears to many to be central to interpreting the text.  Without addressing Aquinas' full argument, the comprehensiveness necessary for Oppy's project has not been achieved. 

An objection Oppy makes to most versions of the cosmological argument is that they all assume some variant of the Principle of Sufficient Reason (PSR).  In a somewhat inconvenient breach of self-containment, instead of actually giving us an argument against the PSR, Oppy refers us to another book of his[2] for the argument.  That argument turns out to be essentially the same as a famous argument of van Inwagen's.[3]  Given the argument's centrality to the chapter on the cosmological argument, it should have been at least briefly stated, which can be done in four sentences, instead of sending the reader to the library.  More seriously, there is no discussion in either book of the (admittedly meager) literature criticizing van Inwagen's argument or trying to work around it.[4]

The discussion of teleological arguments, by contrast, is lucid, detailed, elegant and insightful.  We begin with an excellent reading of Paley's argument according to which Paley's discussion of the watch is not the beginning of an argument from analogy but rather an argument for the correctness of inferring from functional arrangement to artifice.  Oppy criticizes this argument without making use of Darwinian premises, and then goes on to tackle fine-tuning and Behe's irreducible complexity argument, doing a particularly good job with the latter in a small compass.  However, one serious slip in the discussion of teleological arguments is to slide between two different explananda: the appearance of function in organisms and the existence of function in organisms (p. 184).  That an evolutionary explanation (say) can be given for the appearance of function does not entail that an evolutionary explanation can be given for the existence of function.  This is important to Oppy's claimed comprehensiveness.  Although an evolutionary explanation can be given of what an organ in fact does (e.g., the eye's conveying visual information to the brain), Plantinga has argued that an evolutionary explanation cannot be given of its being the function of the organ to do that, as one cannot reduce teleological facts to facts about natural selection.[5]

Finally, Oppy discusses, generally with brevity, a number of "minor evidential arguments", such as those from miracles, religious experience, consciousness, morality and beauty.  Some of these arguments have not received sufficient attention, such as Taylor's argument that our senses are like an inscription in that both convey information and hence our senses should be taken to be products of intelligent design just like inscriptions and hopefully will receive that attention after Oppy's work.  Others do not deserve attention, such as the argument that the world is getting worse as a result of the rise in atheism and hence theism is true, though comprehensiveness may require Oppy to discuss them. 

Unfortunately, some of the discussions of "minor" arguments are too brief to do justice to the arguments.  The argument that Jesus is Lord, lunatic or liar is dismissed by raising doubt about the reliability of New Testament data about Jesus' sayings and by suggesting that there are other explanations of Jesus' claim to be son of God, such as childhood indoctrination (p. 406).  No attempt, however, is made to see whether the doubts about reliability and the proposed alternative explanations cohere with the best in historical scholarship, without which Oppy's discussion is epistemically useless, and might as well have been left out.

Oppy's discussion of miracles uses two examples, an alleged recovery from an illness where the person is close to death with a lack of a scientific explanation, and Moses' alleged parting of the Red Sea.  The recovery, Oppy notes, could have a naturalistic explanation even if none is known now, while the non-theist will surely doubt that Moses parted the Red Sea.  In general, thus, we can always suppose there could be a naturalistic explanation or doubt the occurrence of the alleged event.  However, this generalization does not follow, since Oppy's two cases are straw men.  Unlike the case of the parting of the Red Sea, a serious argument from a famous historical miracle would make use of an event with alleged multiple independent witness chains, such as the resurrection of Jesus.  To show that one can reasonably doubt the occurrence of the alleged event would then require serious examination of the historical evidence. 

Serious arguments from alleged recent healings would need to involve more detailed case descriptions than a "near death" recovery, with a careful examination of the likelihood of a naturalistic explanation (for instance, in a case of a re-materialization of a destroyed eye[6], the likelihood of a naturalistic explanation would be extremely low) and of the reliability of witnesses.  Examinations of the possibility of a scientific explanation are indeed routinely done by apparently independent experts commissioned by the Vatican as part of beatification and canonization proceedings, and it is the cases of such well-attested and carefully scientifically scrutinized alleged miracles that would need to be examined in detail, rather than a vague semi-hypothetical case. 

Oppy has certainly given the reader no reason to think that in every case of an alleged miracle either it is plausible to think there is a naturalistic explanation or it is plausible to think the event did not occur.  On the other hand, Oppy does give us an excellent counterexample to Hume's general argument against the credibility of miracles: a novel scientific discovery may go against the universal testimony of our senses in the past, and, nonetheless, be credible.

Oppy's examination of arguments for atheism is less thorough, but does include the Problem of Evil, in both deductive and inductive formulations, as well as Quentin Smith's argument from Hartle-Hawking cosmology.  Oppy concludes that the theist can reject all these arguments, but at the same time argues that there is more to the deductive argument from evil than most philosophers of religion think, and argues that skeptical theism is incompatible with our ethical practices.

Overall, the scope of the book is comprehensive and the writing is clear, but the book is spotty in quality, as is all but inevitable given the scope.  Nonetheless, the work has many a spark of brilliance that makes it all worthwhile.





[1] New York: Cambridge University Press, 1995.

[2] Philosophical Perspectives on Infinity, New York: Cambridge University Press, 2006.

[3] An Essay on Free Will, Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1983, pp. 202-204.  Versions of the argument were earlier defended by James Ross (Philosophical Theology, Indianapolis: Bobbs-Merrill, 1969, pp. 295-304) and William Rowe (The Cosmological Argument, Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1975).

[4] E.g., Christopher S. Hill, "On a Revised Version of the Principle of Sufficient Reason", Pacific Philosophical Quarterly 63 (1982), 236-242.  (A detailed critical discussion of van Inwagen's argument is also found in Alexander R. Pruss, The Principle of Sufficient Reason: A Reassessment, New York: Cambridge University Press, 2006, but that book came out simultaneously with Oppy's.)

[5] Alvin Plantinga, Warrant and Proper Function, Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1993.

[6] Such a miracle is claimed in Bernard C. Ruffin, Padre Pio: The True Story, Our Sunday Visitor, 1991.