Argument and Persuasion in Descartes' Meditations

Placeholder book cover

David Cunning, Argument and Persuasion in Descartes' Meditations, Oxford University Press, 2010, 235pp., $74.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780195399608.

Reviewed by Catherine Wilson, University of Aberdeen


David Cunning's Argument and Persuasion in Descartes' Meditations is three very different books, Book A, Book B, and Book C, enclosed between a single cover. While Book C is the best of the three in the opinion of this reviewer, there are valuable insights and discussions in Books A and B.

Book A tries to show how the Meditations is an argument addressed to a range of different seventeenth-century readers, including Aristotelians, mechanists, atheists, and skeptics, groups characterized by their different basic beliefs and presuppositions about God, the soul, and the world, all of them erroneous. Book B is a step-by-step exposition of Descartes' Meditations with discussion and interpretation of selected passages. Book C -- the unintentional book -- has little to do with either argument or persuasion. Rather, it is a study of the unexpectedly Spinozistic cast to Descartes' thought. Descartes comes across as a philosopher for whom God can no longer be considered as a responsive personality with intentions but only as identical with the nature and necessity of things, laid down once and irrevocably for all time. Cunning argues that Descartes is committed to human free will only considered as an experience, not as liberty of indifference. This is an original and challenging interpretation, yet the evidence Cunning presents is compelling.

In favour of the persuasion thesis of Book A, it might be observed that Descartes was deeply concerned with his reception; he refers repeatedly in his letters to his ambition to have his natural philosophy and his metaphysical theses accepted. But some further unpacking and spelling out of the thesis that the language of the Meditations is carefully contrived so as to be accepted by a range of readers rather than simply representing the terminology available to Descartes would have been useful. Perhaps it is obvious that the Aristotelians are wedded to a form-matter analogy and real qualities, that the mechanists understand the generation of qualities aright but do not acknowledge an incorporeal human soul, that the atheists do not acknowledge God, and that the skeptics doubt that certain knowledge of nature is possible, but it would have been interesting to learn more about these different constituencies, especially as Cunning's copious citations indicate that he knows far more about the Cartesian audience than he is putting down.

Surely he is right to say that the Meditator's posture of confusion at the start of the book mirrors the confused status of his various potential readers as well as the confusion of having so many alternatives available. Yet when Cunning suggests that "Descartes allows his Meditator to arrive at clear and distinct perceptions by a sincere pursuit of conceptions and assumptions that Descartes himself takes to be confused" (p. 214) and that his rigorous argumentation is not only preceded by confusion but "surrounded by confusion" (p. 35), the confusion theme seemed overstretched. Surely Descartes' responses to the objections of his critics indicate that he considers his argument, once launched, to be flawless and as meriting acceptance by everyone rationally persuadable.

Book B, in turn, is an exceptionally careful treatment of some of the main controversies in Descartes interpretation, some going back quite far to the Anglophone literature of the 1970s, for example, over whether the Meditator establishes the incorporeality of the mind or its substantiality in Meditation II or only later in Meditation VI and over whether the Meditator establishes that clear and distinct perceptions are true or merely that they compel irresistible acceptance. Where the exposition is concerned there is little to fault, for Cunning has been meticulous in noticing and keeping track of fine points of controversy and making cross-textual comparisons. There are small points of a doubtful nature; for example, it does not seem strictly correct to say that "the world literally contains no light" (p. 65) or that ideas of colour are "materially false" (p. 19) as opposed to confused. Does Descartes not reserve material falsehood for ideas like "cold" which represent an absence as something positive and for the non-existent pagan Gods, while heat is not a materially false idea, just a confused sensation? (cf. p. 115).

But Cunning does not quite do justice to Meditation V, with its ontological or logico-linguistic proof for the existence of God, or to Meditation VI, with its lengthy discussion of mind-body unity. The ontological argument is very unlike the three arguments for the existence of God of Meditation III, which appeal to causes and effects, and which were apparently sufficient to establish the existence of a non-deceiving God. Why not explain the seemingly intrusive afterthought as a set up for the coming discussion of essences or true natures, first of mathematical objects, then of mind and body? Cunning finds Descartes' project somewhat vitiated by the fact that embodiment produces confusion. But surely the theory of mind-body connection, physically and metaphysically elaborated in Meditation VI, is the very point of the Meditations, linking the work to Descartes' background scientific program. Indeed, the theological doctrines and the distinctness proof are plausibly seen as necessary framing devices for the Cartesian ambition to explain all of inanimate nature from meteorology to embryology (where the Aristotelian needs to be converted and the mechanist supported) and for the Cartesian programme of psychological medicine.

In Book C, the author comes into his own. In his discussion of Descartes' conception of free will in Meditation IV, Cunning argues persuasively that Descartes is a compatibilist, by which he means that Descartes believes that God has decreed all his thoughts and actions immutably and for eternity, at the same time allowing him a first-person experience of volition (p. 128ff.). While I would not term this position "compatibilism" but rather an "error theory", it is well supported; for the compatibility that is asserted is between the feeling of independence and our subjection to God's will in every thought and action. Cunning pays close attention to the language of Meditation IV (AT VII:57-8) with its claim that when we act freely "our inclinations are such that we do not feel we are determined by any external force" (p. 134), and he directs us to the letter to Princess Elizabeth of 6 October 1645 (AT IV:284) in which Descartes declares that "philosophy by itself is able to discover that the slightest thought could not enter into a person's mind without God's willing, and having so willed from all eternity, that it should so enter" (p. 129). The Conversation with Burman amplifies these points, and one can see here what inspired Spinoza and unnerved Leibniz.

In Chapter 8, Cunning discusses the famous letter to Mersenne of 1630 (AT I:153), in which Descartes identifies God's willing, understanding and creating as a single act which leaves no room for a distinction between possibilities entertained by God and those realized by God (p. 192). He skillfully draws attention to the rather fatalistic later passages in which Descartes recommends the grateful or merely submissive acceptance of all the events of our lives and to the remark in the Passions of the Soul (AT I:438) to the effect that we only regret lost opportunities when we do not grasp the causes that put them out of reach (p. 141). This sense of amor fati is strengthened by Descartes' declaration to Chanut (AT IV:609) that the wise man "so loves this divine decree, deems it so just and necessary, and knows that he must be so completely subject to it" that he would not alter it "even if per impossible, he could do so" (p. 139).

Those who construe Descartes' philosophy as resting on iconoclastic notions of intellectual autonomy, mastery of nature and a sense of independence bordering on solipsism will need to rethink as a result of this book. The passive acceptance of God/Nature is of course very different from the acceptance of authority, dogma, textual traditions, precedents and history, and the great virtue of the book is that it brings out this distinction so clearly. The text is much enlivened by its excellent footnotes and imaginative juxtapositions. Departing from the straight and narrow of exposition, the final chapter touches on philosophers from Malebranche to Kant to Kuhn by way of exploring the relationship between current commitments and philosophical exploration. I much recommend this worthwhile and original book, especially its second half.