Argumentation Schemes

Placeholder book cover

Douglas Walton, Chris Reed, and Fabrizio Macagno, Argumentation Schemes, Cambridge University Press, 2008, 443pp., $32.99 (pbk), ISBN 9780521723749.

Reviewed by Leo Groarke, Wilfrid Laurier University


This is a valuable book from the forefront of research on argument. Over the last half century, the study of informal argument has emerged as a key focus in a variety of disciplines. In philosophy, the locus of such study has been "informal logic," which has devoted itself to the study and teaching of natural language argument.

Early work in informal logic tended to take a "fallacy approach" to argument assessment. Arguments were categorized in terms of traditional fallacies: ad ignorantiam, ad hominem, equivocation, and so on. Much of the work in informal logic and the philosophy of argument continues to assume this approach. This is especially evident in textbooks which attempt to teach students how to reason well by teaching them to detect the fallacies that abound in ordinary arguments -- in political debates, in commentaries on science and religion, and in everyday conversation.

Despite the popularity of the fallacy approach, it has been roundly criticized in contemporary work on the theory of argument. Putting aside pedagogical questions raised by an approach to argument that inevitably focuses on poor reasoning, a large and ever growing body of literature has questioned many of the assumptions made about specific fallacies. Most significantly, a series of commentators have pointed out that many instances of traditional fallacies are good arguments. This applies not only in the obvious cases -- it need not be said that some appeals to authority and arguments by analogy are an appropriate, even essential, component of ordinary reasoning -- but in cases where philosophers once dismissed whole categories of argument out of hand. "Attacks against the person", which are clear instances of the traditional ad hominem, may, for example, be very reasonable attacks on someone's credibility, and appeals to pity, ignorance, popular opinion, emotions, and so on, may be the basis of many reasonable conclusions.

In view of such considerations, argumentation "schemes" have begun to supplant traditional fallacies in the analysis of informal argument. As Walton, Reed and Macagno put it:

The most useful and widely used tool so far developed in argumentation theory is the set of argumentation schemes. Argumentation schemes are forms of argument (structures of inference) that represent structures of common types of arguments used in everyday discourse, as well as in special contexts like those of legal argumentation and scientific argumentation. (p. 1)

Unlike fallacies, schemes are not understood as in principle poor forms of arguments, but as general structures which may convey good reasoning.

Walton, Reed and Macagno provide an important overview of this emerging approach to the understanding and assessment of informal argument. In doing so, their book includes a large compendium of sixty-five schemes (everything from "Argument from Threat" to "Abductive Argumentation" to "Full Slippery Slope Argument"), a discussion of the theoretical issues raised by schemes, an account of specific categories of schemes (Causal Argumentation Schemes, Knowledge-Related Schemes, etc.), an investigation of the problems raised by the classification and taxonomy of schemes, an overview of the history of schemes, and an outline of the formalization of schemes and their application to endeavors in areas of computation and Artificial Intelligence.

In discussing schemes, the book adopts a "critical questions" approach. It suggests that a key component of the assessment of an instance of a specific scheme should be the posing of a set of critical questions that are applied to the instance. To take one example, "two-person practical reasoning" (pp. 97-98) is defined as a scheme which has the following premise-conclusion form:

X (the agent) intends to realize A, and tells Y (the expert) this.

As Y sees the situation, B is a necessary (sufficient) condition for carrying out A, and Y tells X this.

Therefore, X should carry out B, unless he has better reasons not to.

In presenting the scheme, Walton, Reed and Macagno associate it with the following five critical questions.

CQ1: Does X have other goals (of higher priority) that might conflict with the goal of realizing B?

CQ2: Are there alternative means available to X (other than B) for carrying out A?

CQ3: Would carrying out B have known side effects that might conflict with X's other goals.

CQ4: Is it possible for X to bring about B?

CQ5: Are other actions, in addition to B, required for X to bring about A?

An instance of the scheme should be judged a good argument if its premises are acceptable and one can answer these critical questions in an appropriate way: if this is, for example, an instance in which it is possible for X to bring about B.

As Walton, Reed and Macagno recognize, there are many questions raised by the approach to schemes that they adopt. The list of schemes that they enumerate is large but not comprehensive and one might easily debate the inclusion (or lack of inclusion) of a variety of schemes. The question of what should be recognized as a scheme is a daunting one given that we can, in principle, multiply schemes indefinitely, turning any generalizable form of argument into a corresponding scheme.

In moral deliberation, for example, we often excuse individuals from moral culpability because they are human and it is human to make mistakes. A variant of such reasoning is found in Christ's admonition, "Let he who has not sinned throw the first stone." Though no one has recognized this form of argument as a scheme, we could easily do so (we might call it the "argument from fallibility") and associate it with attendant critical questions which will help determine when it is, and is not, appropriate to conclude that "Therefore we should excuse this person, X, from his wrong doing, Y." These questions might ask whether the person in question is contrite, whether there were any countervailing circumstances that excuse the behavior, and so on and so forth.

Putting aside debates about what should and should not be recognized as an argumentation scheme, one might question accounts of specific schemes. Some of the schemes in this book are not elegantly stated and the distinctions between similar schemes can be difficult to discern in the interpretation of ordinary arguments. In many, possibly most, cases, informal arguments do not exactly match the account of a scheme we find in a compendium like the one proposed. In the actual assessment of argument this frequently means that we must recognize that the meaning of some set of sentences can be summarized in terms of some standard scheme. But the interpretation this depends on is less clear than we might desire, especially as it is often possible to interpret a particular informal argument as an instance of different schemes, depending on the implicit meaning we attribute to it.

From a theoretical point of view, the perspective that Walton, Reed and Macagno offer is open to much debate. It suggests a view of schemes that understands them as "defeasible" rather than "deductive" (though the word is sometimes, confusingly, used to refer to claims rather than arguments) but they themselves note that schemes can in principle be recognized as deductive arguments with implicit premises that correspond to the various critical questions with which they are associated. At least from a pedagogical point of view, there are some significant advantages to this approach, for it allows is to see schemes as very straightforward recipes for the construction of good arguments.

Though the book in many cases raises more questions than it answers, it will be a valuable contribution to the interdisciplinary endeavor which now goes by the name "argumentation theory." Particularly notable is the discussion of attempts to formalize schemes and their consequent use in computational modeling, a development which points the way toward an intriguing study of argument that is emerging as an amalgam of philosophy, informal logic, rhetoric, dialectics, pragma-dialectics, artificial intelligence and computational modeling.

The idea that schemes should displace fallacies as the basis of a theoretical account of informal argument is not new or novel, but has been circulating in the realm of argumentation theory for the last twenty years. That said, the volume will very usefully push the study of argument in this direction by providing an overview of the issues raised by the approach which will be a touchstone for further work.