Aristotelian Interpretations

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Fran O'Rourke, Aristotelian Interpretations, Irish Academic Press, 2016, 366pp., $32.69 (hbk), ISBN 9781911024231.

Reviewed by Arthur Madigan, S.J., Boston College


This volume brings together ten of Fran O’Rourke’s essays published between 2003 and 2015. Most of these first appeared in edited collections, including three collections published in Athens that might be particularly difficult to obtain. Despite being written for different occasions, the essays exhibit a remarkable unity or consistency of viewpoint. They are not so much a series of interpretations of various Aristotelian texts, as a series of interpretations of philosophical and scientific issues from an Aristotelian point of view.

O’Rourke writes in a voice that is both recognizably Aristotelian and distinctively his own. While he is well aware of the exegetical and philosophical work on Aristotle done by (for instance) John Cooper, Terence Irwin, G.E.R. Lloyd, Martha Nussbaum, and Richard Sorabji, his own approach is different, focusing mainly on what the French would call the grandes lignes of Aristotle’s philosophy or what we might call his Big Ideas. Where recent work on Aristotle in English for the most part ignores Thomas Aquinas, Aquinas is a strong if unobtrusive presence in this book; the bibliography lists eight of his books and the index gives him 29 entries. For the record, O’Rourke’s first book was Pseudo-Dionysius and the Metaphysics of Aquinas (Brill, 1992). Readers looking for the latest exegesis of Metaphysics Zeta 13, Nicomachean Ethics I 7, or similar classic texts may not find what they are looking for in this book. Readers looking for a broadly Aristotelian reflection on contemporary issues are likely to find in it a wealth of stimulating insights.

Remarkably for someone writing on Aristotle, O’Rourke begins (1-19) with a “Portrait of the Author as a Young Aristotelian,” recounting his childhood experiences of farm life in the Irish midlands, of Galway and Connemara, of hillwalking and sailing in Ireland, of traveling and mountain climbing in Greece. This narrative establishes a closeness to nature that has fostered O’Rourke’s affinity with Aristotle. In this context he then (19-28) raises the curtain on the ten chapters that follow.

Chapter 1, “Wonder and Universality. Philosophy and Poetry in Aristotle,” explores the many similarities between philosophy and poetry as Aristotle understood them: their universal scope, their origin in wonder, their aim to express “the elusive mystery of reality” (32). The desire to know the origin of all things, to grasp the totality of the real, lies at the root of poetry and philosophy alike.

Following up on this, Chapter 2, “Philosophy and Poetry in Aristotle. Interpreting and Imitating Nature,” gives an Aristotelian take on the ancient quarrel between poetry and philosophy (Republic 607b). Where Plato had intensified the quarrel by separating transcendent truth from sense experience, Aristotle grounded the human search for truth on sensible reality, thereby restoring the unity of knowledge and healing the quarrel. Aristotle understands art as an imitation of nature, not in the sense that a work of art is an image of a natural substance, but in the sense that the human creative process imitates natural growth. The goal of art, and in particular the goal of tragic poetry, is to increase our astonishment at what we find in nature.

Chapter 3, “Human Nature and Destiny in Aristotle,” presents a comprehensive survey of Aristotle’s understanding of the human being, drawing on his De anima, biological works, Metaphysics, Nicomachean Ethics, and Politics. While some interpreters play down those texts in which Aristotle asserts that human beings are akin to the divine and suggests that the active mind is in some way separate or separable from the body, O’Rourke takes those passages at full strength, but admits that they are not entirely consistent with Aristotle’s insistence on the unity of the human being. Aristotle believes that our human destiny on some level lies beyond our natural state, even though this threatens his unified metaphysical view of the world. “While it seems Aristotle hoped to discern in man a cipher of transcendence, an element rising above the stream of biological continuity, he did not fully succeed within the terms of his own philosophy” (85).

Chapter 4, “Knowledge and Necessity in Aristotle,” surveys the principal senses of necessity that O’Rourke finds in Aristotle: the necessity of the apprehension of the proper sensibles; the necessity of the principle of non-contradiction; the necessity of truth; the necessity that belongs to Aristotelian causation; the necessity of the form or nature present in individuals; and the necessity of the first mover.

Chapter 5, “Aristotle and the Metaphysics of Metaphor,” argues that the use of metaphor in ordinary speech and in poetry is grounded on the unity in diversity of human nature and of reality generally. The necessary foundation for transferred or metaphorical resemblance is what O’Rourke calls genuine metaphysical analogy. He says, citing Henri Bergson:

if we remove from Aristotle’s philosophy everything derived from poetry, religion, and social life, as well as from a somewhat rudimentary physics and biology, we are left with the grand framework of a metaphysics which, he [Bergson] believes, is the natural metaphysics of the human intellect. (121; this view of Bergson’s is also cited at 28, 181, and 235 and is a leitmotif for the collection)

This natural metaphysics, O’Rourke suggests, is the best explanation for metaphor.

Chapter 6, “Aristotle’s Political Anthropology,” explores three interrelated questions. Is the term “political” proper to humans, or does it also apply to animals? The essential meaning of the term is its distinctively human meaning; it applies to ants, bees, and other such animals only in a secondary and derivative way. How can the polis be described as natural if it does not conform to Aristotle’s definition of a nature (phusis), an immanent principle of motion and rest? While the polis does not strictly speaking have such a principle, it does have what O’Rourke calls “a defining eidos or form” (136-37) that emerges from the natural tendencies of its members. How can the primacy of the polis be reconciled with the fact that its citizens are in some way independent, with autonomous activities and purposes of their own? The polis is prior in the sense that is the necessary condition for its members to live and prosper; without it they could not carry on their activities or carry out their purposes.

Chapter 7, “Aristotle and the Metaphysics of Evolution,” argues at length, and in conversation with Darwin, recent evolutionary biologists such as Ernst Mayr, Stephen Jay Gould, and Richard Dawkins, and scholars of Aristotle’s biology such as David Balme, Allan Gotthelf, and James Lennox, that while Aristotle explicitly rejects the evolution of species, “his philosophy is in many ways eminently receptive to the theory” (145). Aristotle’s metaphysics — meaning by this his concepts of act and potency, form and finality, the nature of causation and the explanation of chance — is precisely what theorists of evolution need in order to address the philosophical questions that their theory raises. While the perennial insights of Aristotle’s metaphysics lie beyond the scope of science, including the life sciences, they are important resources for articulating the life sciences.

On a more controversial note, Chapter 8, “Evolutionary Ethics. A Metaphysical Evaluation,” offers a critical appreciation, from an Aristotelian point of view, of Edward O. Wilson’s Sociobiology and similar works by Michael Ruse and Richard Dawkins. Most fundamentally, “sociobiology is incapable of recognizing the central philosophical question of self-existence” (208), the question posed by Camus: is life worth living? And this question cannot be detached from the metaphysical question of why anything at all should exist.

In the final analysis, evolutionary ethics is founded upon a biological endless regress in which persons have no ultimacy. Human individuals exist for the exclusive purpose of propagating offspring, whose aim is likewise simply to propagate. To what end? . . . . The activity of reproduction is not itself the foundation of morality. (211)

What, then, is the foundation of morality? The answer, O’Rourke suggests, is “the status of each member of the human species as an individual consciously aware of his or her freedom within the totality of the real, and the inescapable demand to make one’s life personally meaningful, with all the possibilities and limits of our common nature” (211-12).

Chapter 9, “Aristotle and Evolutionary Altruism,” continues the Aristotelian criticism of sociobiology. The target here is the claim that human beings are altruistic because altruistic behavior benefits the human gene pool. This is wrong on two main counts. First, observation of animals does not indicate that their behavior is altruistic; but if we do not observe altruism in animal behavior, the project of explaining altruism as a genetic inheritance is wrongheaded. Second, and more importantly, when selfless altruism is found among human beings, it is found not in some supposed tendency of humans to sacrifice themselves for the sake of their species, but in friendships between virtuous people.

Altruism, which it [sociobiology] claims is genetically motivated, is the figleaf providing sociobiology with the appearance of an ethics hitherto difficult to justify within the context of Darwinism. The scandal for traditional ethics has been the problem of evil; the challenge for evolutionary ethics is the fact of goodness, which makes little sense within the struggle for survival. (225)

In Chapter 10, “Joyce and Aristotle,” O’Rourke, who is also the author of Allwisest Stagyrite: Joyce’s Quotations from Aristotle (National Library of Ireland, 2005), presents a fascinating range of data on Joyce’s youthful education in the works of Aristotle, especially the De anima and the Metaphysics. He then considers at some length the Aristotelian features of Ulysses, in particular the recognition that the universe is characterized by analogy or similarity across diversity, the adherence to the principle that art imitates nature (correctly understood, that artistic process is like natural process), the insistence that beauty and tragedy require a certain magnitude, and the commitment to Aristotelian realism as opposed to Platonic idealism. The story of Stephen Dedalus is the story of an Aristotelian confronting both the radical alternative of Platonism and what O’Rourke calls the modern rejection of self. “Aristotelian metaphysics and psychology provide Stephen in Ulysses with the vocabulary and concepts he needs to understand himself and to interpret the world” (240).

Let me close with some marvelously suggestive lines from the Introduction:

We are the only animals that can be happy. Other animals have no share in well-being or in purposive living; their purpose is life, that of man is the good life. Morality and happiness are personal; virtue depends upon ourselves. As a result there is no hiatus between ‘is’ and ‘ought’: the notion of a ‘naturalistic fallacy’ is alien. Man’s ‘is’ is already an ‘ought’, his existence embraces obligation . . . . The distance between ‘is’ and ‘ought’ is that between our raw state and the self-project we discern; the dynamism and tension is the freedom experienced as we cover that distance in reflective acts of self-attainment. (26-27)

Such is the wonderfully humane Aristotelian vision that O’Rourke offers for our consideration.