Aristotelian Philosophy: Ethics and Politics from Aristotle to MacIntyre

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Kelvin Knight, Aristotelian Philosophy: Ethics and Politics from Aristotle to MacIntyre, Polity Press, 2007, 247pp., $26.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780745619774.

Reviewed by Peter C. Meilaender, Houghton College


Kelvin Knight, who previously edited The MacIntyre Reader,[1] has several goals in this new book. He identifies three explicitly: first, "to present an interpretive narrative of the formation of MacIntyre's philosophy"; second, "to chart the main course through the history of ideas taken by MacIntyre's Aristotelian tradition, from Aristotle to himself"; and third (the book's "unifying intention"), "to argue that Aristotelianism has now been revitalized once again, by MacIntyre" (222-23). Weaving these together is an emphasis on the "revolutionary" character of MacIntyre's views. Unlike either Aristotle or the Aristotelian tradition, which Knight characterizes as frequently legitimating elitist and exclusionary politics, MacIntyre offers a theory of the virtues that is inclusive, egalitarian, and deeply opposed to the global capitalist order of (post)modernity. Knight achieves his goals with varying degrees of success, and at times the attempt to juggle so many balls at once leaves his narrative somewhat disconnected, as the effort to trace out an Aristotelian tradition over centuries is punctuated by sideways glances at various interpretive disputes. This is most pronounced in the third chapter, where in a mere 35 pages Knight follows Aristotle's path through the remarkably diverse cast of Luther, Kant, Hegel, Marx, Heidegger, and Gadamer, not to mention several lesser figures and a handful of contemporary thinkers. Knight seems to recognize the problem, admitting, "This book is victim to the author's overnumerous intentions" (222). He is, nevertheless, more successful than not. In particular, his account of MacIntyre's development into a "revolutionary Aristotelian," supplementing Thomist Christianity with a residual fidelity to Marx, is both helpful and persuasive.

The book consists of four chapters: the first on Aristotle, the last on MacIntyre, and two in between to connect the dots by following the trail of an Aristotelian tradition across western thought. The opening chapter on Aristotle centers on the claim that his practical philosophy -- his ethics and politics -- is decisively connected to and shaped by his metaphysics. Knight focuses on several important Aristotelian concepts, in particular theoria, praxis, and poiesis. Theoria, the noblest form of human activity, is the contemplation of that which is eternal and unchanging. Praxis, by contrast, refers to human action or activity in the realm of the contingent, that which could be other than it is and which we seek to affect by our actions. Poiesis refers specifically to production, the purposeful bringing-into-being of something distinct from its human producer. The distinction between theoria and praxis is familiar, but according to Knight that between praxis and poiesis, action and production, is equally important for understanding Aristotle's political views. Because poiesis is undertaken not for its own sake but in order to create some other object, Aristotle regards it as an inferior form of activity, subservient to an external end, that of the product's consumer rather than its producer. Praxis, on the other hand, designates virtuous political and ethical action that contributes directly to the actor's own happiness (eudaimonia), rather than serving ends determined by others.

This distinction between action and production, praxis and poiesis, is philosophically tenuous. After all, "unlike theoria, which produces nothing beyond itself and leaves everything as it is[,] praxeis are, like poieseis, often useful and effective" (16-17). Aristotle does not consistently maintain the distinction, and logically his "more elemental conceptual distinction would [be] that separating theoria from praxis and poiesis alike" (18-19). The real function of Aristotle's distinction between action and production is to underscore his "denigration of lives spent in occupations other than those of philosophy or politics" (16). The distinction permits Aristotle to argue that properly political and ethical praxis, like theoria, pursues ends internal to its own activity, unlike the mere technical knowledge involved in productive crafts, which pursue ends external to themselves and must therefore be directed by an architectonic master craft. Knight thus suggests that Aristotle uses his metaphysical claims to justify an exclusionary politics, in which the majority of subjects are regarded as unable to lead virtuous lives or contribute to a genuinely common good, but rather serve as means to the happiness of the fortunate few who govern them: "Too often" (referring now to later adaptations of Aristotle's framework) "this image of political community has served as an explanation of how oppressive and exploitative social relations supposedly benefit even those who are oppressed and exploited. In other words, it has served as a legitimatory ideology" (39).

I am inclined to think that Knight's reading of Aristotle in this respect is too harsh. To be sure, Aristotle is less confident than we that all members of a polity can contribute positively to its good governance, a hesitation reflected in his reluctance to extend citizenship to "vulgar craftsmen" and his claim that "not everyone without whom there would not be a city-state is to be regarded as a citizen" (Politics III.5, a passage, however, which must be read in its broader context, the discussion of the difference between the good citizen and the good man).[2] Still, while Aristotle may regard aristocracy as the best form of government, he recognizes that already by the time of his own writing, the conditions capable of supporting it are rare and likely to become rarer still (Politics III.15). And he argues forcefully -- twice! -- that not even the argument on behalf of rule by the virtuous will typically generate, on its own, just government (Politics III.10 and III.13). He also argues that the most just form of government available to a wide range of cities, the form he calls "polity," extends citizenship reasonably widely (Politics IV.11). Finally, his argument that the rule of law is desirable under most circumstances is predicated fundamentally upon a recognition of broad equality (Politics III.13-17). In all of these respects, Aristotle's political science is, I think, significantly more egalitarian than Knight takes it to be. Still, Knight's argument is both careful and fair, drawing on a close reading of relevant Aristotelian texts, and my view, not his, is a minority one on this score.

Knight's second and third chapters trace a tradition of Aristotelian political thought across two millennia. Chapter two focuses on the emergence of Christianity and the medieval period, chapter three on the twisting course of Aristotelianism through German philosophy, from Luther to Gadamer. Christianity introduced a new emphasis on the equality of all persons and the dignity of labor, together with the concept of sin and a distinction between the heavenly and temporal kingdoms. Christian thinkers defended various forms of "communal functionalism" (a term Knight borrows from Cary Nederman), enabling them to describe a wide range of human activity, including productive labor, as making essential contributions to the common good. Aristotle's most important Christian interlocutor is of course Aquinas, whose effort to combine Augustinian theology with an Aristotelian account of the natural dignity of political life resulted in a synthesis, Knight suggests, more egalitarian and less conservative than Aristotle's own theory.

The chapter on "Aristotle in Germany" considers so many thinkers, who differ so widely among themselves, that it resists easy summary. I confess that here I found myself occasionally losing the thread of Knight's narrative. Since not all of the thinkers discussed in this section could plausibly be called "Aristotelians," it might be better to describe the chapter as a series of cameo descriptions of how various German thinkers -- in particular Hegel, who receives the most attention -- have reacted to or made use of Aristotle's thought. Knight suggests that after Lutheran and Kantian challenges to Aristotle, Hegel revived (and adapted) Aristotle's conception of a rational political order furthering the human telos and incorporating within civil society the full range of citizen contributions to the common good. Nevertheless, Hegel's theory retained excessively conservative and quietist political implications because of its tendency to bless the rationality of the actually existing political order. Marx and other "Left Hegelians," however, sowed the seeds for a more radical critique, one that MacIntyre would ultimately develop and reconcile with Aristotelianism, by arguing that capitalist production prevents workers from fully participating in the social telos to which they contribute.[3]

Knight's final and longest chapter, making up almost half the volume, contains a thorough and extremely helpful account of the development of MacIntyre's thought, from his early Marxism through his deepening encounter with Aristotelianism and ultimately his move toward Thomism. Knight's discussion would provide valuable background for examinations of MacIntyre in both graduate and advanced undergraduate courses. He persuasively illustrates the continuity of MacIntyre's thought and his consistent preoccupation, from his Marxist days onward, with the relationship between free human activity and its social context. From Marxism MacIntyre took not only a critique of capitalism as alienating workers from the fruits of their labor and thus denying them the opportunity to participate, as free and rational agents, in the shaping of a common life. He also borrowed the related insight that moral philosophy is always rooted in some particular web of social relations, which it both reflects and helps to legitimate. MacIntyre finally broke with Marxism not because he had abandoned its revolutionary ideal of freeing all citizens to participate in self-governing activity, but because communists themselves had done so. (One is reminded, despite the different political orientation, of Reagan's quip, "I didn't leave the Democratic Party. The party left me.") By accepting the need for a party elite to manage socialist revolution and oversee communist society, they had themselves adopted the managerial conception of rationality that, rather than enabling all to deliberate together about collective ends, took those ends as given and sought merely the most effective means for achieving them. Rather than mount a genuine challenge to manipulative modern social relations, communists in the wake of Stalin had simply substituted one elite for another.

MacIntyre located a more adequate alternative to liberal, capitalist modernity in Aristotle. By reformulating Aristotle's theory of the virtues in terms of his well-known account of the pursuit of goods internal to practices, MacIntyre accomplished several goals. In contrast to the means-end rationality of bureaucratic capitalism, he elaborated an account of human action that subjected the ends of activity also to rational deliberation. By embedding that account within the framework of social practices, he was able to explain the close connection between individual and communal flourishing and to show how a philosophical theory of ethics is embedded in a sociological context. MacIntyre's account of practices establishes the centrality of the virtues to a flourishing human life. Furthermore, because he recognizes a wide range of practices as possible sites for the acquisition of virtue, MacIntyre avoids Aristotle's troublesome distinction between praxis and poiesis and offers a more egalitarian and inclusive account of ethics and politics. At the same time, by distinguishing between practices and their contingent institutional bearers, MacIntyre opens up space for participants in a practice to criticize current institutional arrangements on behalf of the characteristic goods of their collective activity, thus retaining the revolutionary potential of his earlier Marxism within a broadly Aristotelian account of human nature and action. As Knight says late in his description of MacIntyre's development: "Concerned only with the self-activity of some, Aristotle celebrated the management of others. Concerned with the potential self-activity of all, MacIntyre condemns everything that prevents their free cooperation" (213). Aided first by his Marxism, later by his theism, MacIntyre thus succeeds in formulating "a revolutionary Aristotelianism" (the title of Knight's fourth chapter).

While this brief summary does not do justice to Knight's careful explication of the changes in MacIntyre's thought, an explication informed by an impressive familiarity with MacIntyre's substantial body of work (the entries for MacIntyre alone consume four pages of the book's bibliography), it does indicate his central concern to reclaim MacIntyre's potential for a radical politics. This is an important contribution, particularly given the tendency, especially since his embrace of Thomism, to assume that MacIntyre's must be a conservative voice. Knight's emphasis on the continued influence of Marx on MacIntyre's thought is thus welcome. At the same time, the decision to frame MacIntyre in these terms raises important questions. We can begin to explore them by considering Knight's decision to juxtapose MacIntyre with the German conversation about Aristotle. To Anglo-American readers, accustomed to thinking of MacIntyre as a participant in the liberal-communitarian debates, this may be initially surprising. That surprise is in some respects fruitful, because MacIntyre himself, of course, has chafed at being cast in those terms (see Knight, 175). It also helps indicate MacIntyre's stature as a major participant in longstanding western philosophical debates, a thinker engaging not only his contemporaries but also the likes of Kant, Hegel, and Heidegger as a worthy sparring partner.

On the other hand, the same decision also has the unintended effect of leading the reader to wonder about MacIntyre's significance for actual controversies in Anglo-American political life. (An important concern, given Knight's repeated emphasis that philosophy, for MacIntyre, should never be simply academic.) The practical relevance of the liberal-communitarian debate is, at least, clear. But outside of the academy, neither Heidegger nor Gadamer -- nor, for that matter, Hegel or Marx -- has powerfully influenced postwar Anglo-American political thought, which has been largely concerned with either defending liberal democracy or offering friendly, internal criticisms of it. Given the stated goal of charting the course of an Aristotelian tradition, why not confront MacIntyre with the challenge of a more "home-grown" Aristotelianism? The point of the question is not that Knight ought to have written a different book. It is, however, to suggest that a full critical assessment of MacIntyre-as-Aristotelian would also require comparing his position to a rather different, Anglo-American Aristotelianism, and in particular to the two foremost representatives of such a perspective: Burke and Tocqueville.

Granted, neither of these thinkers may have been self-consciously Aristotelian (and, yes, I realize that Tocqueville was French). Both, however, have been prominent voices within postwar Anglo-American political reflection, and both can fairly lay claim to the title "Aristotelian." Two features of their thought in particular justify that appellation. First, both blur the distinction between nature and convention in a manner characteristic of Aristotle's ethics, emphasizing the deeply social nature of character formation and thus the inevitably educative role of politics in shaping virtue and vice. Second, both are deeply attentive to what Aristotle himself identified as the defining aspect of any political order, though it receives little consideration in Knight's account: the "constitution" or "regime" (politeia), which by embodying a rough, overarching conception of justice exercises far-reaching influence over all aspects of social life. Furthermore, whereas Knight describes MacIntyre as uncompromisingly hostile towards liberal democracy (see esp. his valuable discussion of the political consequences of MacIntyre's ethics on pp. 179-89), both Burke and Tocqueville represent a version of Aristotelianism that has, one might say, made its peace -- though in both cases a wary one -- with liberal democracy.

This difference in particular would make such a comparison valuable, for it would ultimately raise deep questions about the adequacy of MacIntyre's position, in particular by challenging the attempted Thomist synthesis of Aristotelianism and Augustinianism. For the "regime" of liberal democracy can be understood as an Augustinian, rather than a Thomist, Aristotelianism. It represents the lowering of political ambitions that occurs when the hope for a "thoroughly inclusive common good" (179) or a "commonly understood and agreed end" (188) is sought not in temporal politics, but in the City of God. It is in this respect telling that when Knight illustrates MacIntyre's desired form of political activity, his example -- the carrying forward of a common and cooperative project such as a hospital -- involves no recognition of the coercive element in political life (180-82). (More striking: carrying out such a project, which presumably should be "thoroughly inclusive" and aim at a "commonly … agreed end" requires the inclusion of "physicians, nurses, therapists of various kinds, actual and potential patients and those who have responsibility for children or the aged," but the exclusion of "representatives of insurance companies or … bureaucratic managers"! [183, citing MacIntyre]) Similarly, when Knight wishes to suggest that MacIntyre's political vision is applicable beyond the very local level, his example is, again, not political -- it is the Catholic church (184). A confrontation with plausibly Aristotelian defenders of liberal democracy such as Burke and Tocqueville -- with, as it were, an additional set of "rival Aristotles" -- would thus force what is, presumably, the ultimate question for MacIntyre-as-Aristotelian: whether the Thomist synthesis works.[4]

That said, just as we can be grateful to MacIntyre for his revitalization of Aristotle in the present day, so too can we be grateful to Knight for a lucid and valuable account of MacIntyre's own thought. His book helps to clarify MacIntyre's philosophical lineage and in particular to re-assert the continued importance of his early Marxism. In so doing, it helps to make the case for "revolutionary Aristotelianism" as not the oxymoron it might initially appear, but rather a powerful contemporary alternative to both conservatism and liberal democracy.

[1] Cambridge: Polity Press, 1998.

[2] The citation is from C.D.C. Reeve's translation: Aristotle, Politics (Indianapolis: Hackett Publishing Company, 1998), p. 74.

[3] Although Knight borrows the term "Left Hegelians" from Bernard Yack, he neither refers to nor includes in his bibliography Yack's The Problems of a Political Animal (Los Angeles: University of California Press, 1993), one of the very best books on Aristotle's political theory -- an omission that is relevant to the questions I raise at the end of this review.

[4] The reference to "rival Aristotles" I take from MacIntyre himself. See his two "Rival Aristotles" essays that open MacIntyre, Ethics and Politics: Selected Essays, Volume 2 (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2006); cf. esp. p. 40.