Aristotelian Subjectivism: Francisco Suárez’s Philosophy of Perception

Aristotelian Subjectivism Francisco Sua Rez S Philosophy Of Perception

Daniel Heider, Aristotelian Subjectivism: Francisco Suárez’s Philosophy of Perception, Springer, 2021, 304pp., $139.99 (hbk), ISBN 9783030673406.

Reviewed by Stephan Schmid, Universität Hamburg


According to a tenacious historiographical narrative which continues to influence many approaches to early modern philosophy (despite having often been challenged), it is a distinctive feature of non- or anti-Aristotelian thinkers of this period that, unlike their scholastic opponents, they put special emphasis on our subjectivity. This is so not only in ethical debates, where they emphasize the value of each individual subject, but also in theories of knowledge and cognition. According to this narrative, non-Aristotelian thinkers of the early modern period emphasize the subjective character of our cognitive states, claiming that these states typically involve a kind of self-awareness, such that I—as a thinking subject—am not only aware of my mental states, but also of the fact that these states belong to me. Daniel Heider’s rich and highly informed study on Francisco Suárez’s theory of perception provides an important correction to this narrative. It makes the convincing case that the late scholastic philosopher and theologian Suárez (1548–1617) not only acknowledged this kind of subjectivity of mental states, but also offers a sophisticated account which does not compromise the objectivity of these perceptions—that is, their reliable relatedness to objects in the extra-mental world. Since Suárez acknowledges the objective aspect of perception and accounts for it in hylomorphist terms by appealing to an assimilation of forms, Heider classifies his theory as an instance of “Aristotelian subjectivism” (273). Indeed, Heider even argues that Suárez’s account of the subjectivity of perception, “due to his specific reified version of this theory, can much better than other Aristotelians conceive this perception as being ‘colored’ by the ‘ownness’” (272). Moreover, he finds that “Suárez’s philosophy of perception strikes a new and dynamic balance between criteria related to the subjective and objective aspects” of perception (274). This also seems to distinguish Suárez’s theory from non-Aristotelian theories of perception of the early modern period, which tend to neglect the objective character of perception, according to which our perceptions are essentially related to real and mind-independent qualities (274), and consequently run into all kinds of epistemological and skeptical problems. This also seems to distinguish Suárez’s theory from non-Aristotelian theories of perception of the early modern period, which tend to neglect the objective character of perception and consequently run into all kinds of epistemological and skeptical problems. In contrast, according to , Suárez, our perceptions are essentially related to real and mind-independent qualities (274).

Heider, however, is not only interested in large historiographical claims and observations. On the contrary, his point about the particularly subjective character of Suárez’s Aristotelian theory of perception is based on an impressively detailed analysis of Suárez’s Commentaria una cum quaestionibus in libros Aristotelis De anima (CDA for short), which is both historically and philosophically informed. Suárez wrote this text between 1570–1575, and partially revised it before his death in 1617. Heider’s book is the first study of this text directed to an international audience, and it shows that there are other works of Suárez—besides his well-known Metaphysical Disputations (1597)—that are worth being studied. On the strength of this point alone, Heider’s work is an important and valuable contribution to present scholarship.

Heider’s reconstruction of Suárez’s theory of perception is developed over four rich and remarkably self-contained chapters (Chapters 2–5). This has an advantage. Readers who are interested only in certain facets of Suárez’s theory of perception can immediately jump to the relevant chapters (when necessary, Heider refers his selective readers back to where the relevant presuppositions of his analysis are explained). Heider’s discussion is extremely fine-grained and very close to Suárez’s original text. But it offers much more than a paraphrase of Suárez’s reasoning because it reconstructs Suárez’s arguments in their historical and systematic context. Regarding the historical context, Heider sketches the background of Suárez’s thought not only in relation to his main references, Aristotle and Aquinas, but also with reference to the relevant accounts of other (late-)medieval philosophers (such as Augustine, Avicenna, Averroes, Olivi, Scotus, Auriol, Jandun, and Cajetan) and exponents of the medical tradition (such as Galen, Vallés, and Vesalius). Heider also illuminates Suárez’s considerations of his CDA by reference to other works of Suárez, such as (i) his unfinished Tractatus de anima (Suárez’s later revision of the CDA), as well as (ii) his Metaphysical Disputations. The references to the latter work especially show that central elements of Suárez’s later metaphysical system (such as his distinction of res and modes) were already in place in his 1570s. Furthermore, Heider often clarifies his interpretation of Suárez by referring to Suárez’s Jesuit contemporaries and followers (such as Toledo, Mendoza, or Oviedo) or early modern Thomists (such as Poinsot) and Scotists (such as Mastrius and Belluto). All this makes Heider’s book a rich source for late-medieval and Renaissance theories of perception in general. Regarding the systematic context of Suárez’s considerations, Heider is very much concerned with highlighting the philosophical aspects of Suárez’s theory of perception that are still discussed today, e.g., problems concerning the intentionality, consciousness, and unity of perception.

It is not possible to adequately trace Heider’s rich and detailed analysis of Suárez’s theory of perception here. Instead, I want to highlight its major steps in order to sketch the general picture of Suárez’s account of perception that it reveals. I conclude by pointing at two problems that seem to arise from the ensuing picture, but which Heider seems to miss in his generally sympathetic and optimistic assessment of Suárez’s philosophy of perception.

Heider reconstructs Suárez’s theory of sense perception in four substantial chapters. Chapter 2 lays out the metaphysical framework: Suárez’s (at least apparently) hylomorphist view that perception is a vital operation performed by powers that belong to the soul, which in turn is to be conceived of as the substantial form of a sentient being. I say “at least apparently” because Heider’s reconstruction makes it clear that Suárez defends a thoroughly reificationist conception of traditional hylomorphic principles, insofar as he takes many of them to be really distinct res, for which it is metaphysically possible to exist independently of one another. According to Suárez, it is not only the soul and its (prime) matter that are such distinct res (24–25), but also the powers of the soul and their acts or operations, which Suárez determines to be real qualities (51–58). But even though the powers and their acts are really distinct from the soul, they are intimately tied to it through two types of causality. Through (accidental) formal causality, the cognitive acts or operations inhere in their underlying powers, which in turn inhere in their underlying soul. Meanwhile, from the other direction, the soul, its powers, and its operations are linked together through efficient causation: the powers of the soul “flow” or “emanate” from the soul by what Suárez calls “natural resultance” and these powers efficiently cause their acts or operation with the assistance of the underlying soul. The last point is crucial to Suárez’s theory: By construing the soul as being causally involved in our cognitive operations, Suárez can maintain the soul as the subject of its cognitive operations after having declared its powers to be really distinct from the soul. Furthermore, he can—and this a central point of Heider’s interpretation—account for their subjective character: my cognitive acts involve a kind of self-awareness because they are ultimately caused by my soul (by means of its powers).

In the following two chapters, Heider provides a detailed reconstruction of Suárez’s theory of the external senses, that is, our vision, hearing, taste, smell, and touch. Chapter 3 is devoted to the general features of the external senses. Amongst other things, Heider explains why Suárez held that our sense-perception requires “sensible species” (a type of forms postulated to explain the actualization of our sensory powers and their acts being about certain sensible qualities; 67–72), and how these species affect the powers of the soul (without automatically causing a cognitive act). With respect to this process, Heider again highlights the causal role of the soul: while sensible species (in the medium) can affect our sensible powers directly to produce an “impressed species” in the power, this impressed species is to be distinguished from the proper act of perception (82–85). The proper act of perception is another act in the sensory power (ontologically speaking, it is another real quality inhering in this power) which, unlike the impressed species, is co-caused by the soul (91). As a result, this second perceptual act is both conscious and intentional: it is conscious because by co-causing this act the soul is aware of it (118–119), and it is about the sensory quality that caused the sensible species impressed in the soul’s underlying power since it is caused in the image of that species. As Heider points out, however (101–104), the intentionality of the perceptual act is primitive for Suárez—they are simply about the qualities  on the basis of which they are formed. In particular, their intentionality is not mediated by representations of such qualities—not even in cases of deception where these acts are about certain things being in a certain way which are in fact either quite different or do not exist at all. But even though there are non-veridical perceptual acts for Suárez, there are limits to their non-veridicality, which makes Suárez’s theory robustly anti-skeptical (at least in its aspiration; see 128–130 and 261–262).

Chapter 4 takes up particular issues about the five individual senses. How are they individuated? How are the different sensible species transmitted? Which are the proper media of these transmissions and how does the reception of these species in the single sense organs and their powers work in detail? In discussing Suárez’s answers to these questions, Heider draws on an impressive knowledge of historical debates, which makes this chapter an invaluable source for late-medieval debates about the physical and physiological processes involved in perception.

In Chapter 5, Heider provides a comprehensive account of Suárez’s theory of the internal sense. This sense, Suárez holds, not only accounts for our (perceptual) memory and imagination, but also—and in particular—for our ability to perceive unified sensory objects i.e., things or substances in which various sensory qualities are united. As Heider lays it out, Suárez argues (against many of his scholastic predecessors and contemporaries) that there is only one single internal sense, which can perform a range of different functions. Suárez is also shown to teach that the peculiar “valence” (or “intention” in scholastic parlance) of our perceptual acts, that is, their action-prompting aspects (such as the “hostility” a sheep perceives when it perceives a wolf), are in fact modes of these acts, which provide the basis of the internal sense’s estimation of the perceived objects. Perceiving unified sensory objects with a peculiar (action-prompting) valence is in fact the main function of Suárez’s inner sense. All other functions that Thomists have attributed to the internal senses under the name of the vis cogitativa and vis aestimativa—that is, the ability to engage in forms of (quasi-) reasoning and practical deliberation—are relegated to the intellect by Suárez. Accordingly, for Suárez, non-rational animals can at best perceive the agreeability or disagreeability of an object and react in line with their natural instincts without engaging in any kind of proto-syllogistic reasoning.

This reconstruction of Suárez’s theory of perception is complemented by a helpful introduction (Chapter 1)—which gives an overview of the research on Suárez’s philosophy of perception and makes Heider’s goal and methods explicit—and a conclusion (Chapter 6)—which neatly summarizes the main insights of his rich and detailed study, and finally addresses the question of “subjectivity” in Suárez’s theory of perception.

As the first detailed study on Suárez’s theory of perception following Suárez’s Commentary on De anima, Heider’s book, so deeply and widely informed, showcases excellent scholarship. His study is of highest interest to both more broadly oriented scholars, who want to understand the development of early modern philosophy of mind in general, and narrower specialists on Suárez, who seek to come to grips with Suárez’s breath-takingly comprehensive and integrated philosophical system. For the first type of scholar, Heider’s book is particularly revealing insofar as his elaboration on the subjectivity of Suárez’s theory of perception shows that late-Aristotelian and distinctively non- or even anti-Aristotelian approaches to the mind of the early modern period are much more continuous with one another than they are often presented to be. For the specialist on Suárez, Heider’s study will be an indispensable entry-point for any serious future research on Suárez’s philosophy of mind. And as it should be for entry-points, Heider’s study not only gives a wonderfully clear and detailed reconstruction of Suárez’s philosophy of mind in general and theory of perception in particular, which paves the way for further research; it also leaves us with some philosophical problems, which call for further research. Let me conclude by briefly pointing out two such problems.

The first concerns Suárez’s account of the subjectivity of perception, about which Heider writes, with enthusiasm, that it “can much better than other Aristotelians conceive this perception as being ‘colored’ by the ‘ownness’” (272). I am a little less confident. I fail to see how, on Heider’s interpretation, Suárez can successfully explain why perceptual acts are accompanied by any awareness at all. Moreover, even if this demand can be met, there remains a further question as to why this awareness should be thought to amount to a kind of self-awareness, espeically if this manner of awareness is understood to furnish   the perceiver with an infallible notion of her perceptions as being her perceptions. As aforementioned, Heider argues that Suárez can account for the perceptual acts’ specific self-awareness by appealing to the soul ‘s causing these acts (119). But why is the soul’s causing these acts sufficient for making them aware? This question is particularly pressing given that Heider points out that for Suárez, the soul also engages in other types of efficient causation which do not seem to involve any awareness. These are: (1) the soul’s causation of its own powers (62–65) and, (2) more worrying in the present context, the soul’s causation of species of our external senses’ perceptual acts, the so-called “species phantastica”, which are required for the cognitive operations of the internal sense. These species, Heider explains (225), are caused by the soul through the internal sense at the very instance at which we consciously perceive external objects; yet precisely in this moment we seem not to be aware of any act of the internal sense, which we only perceive afterwards (221, n.15). So, given that Suárez appears to accept instances of causal activity by the soul that do not involve any awareness, it seems at least at hoc why the mere causation of perceptual acts should guarantee awareness of these acts. Furthermore, it remains unclear why such awareness should provide us with any notion of our self (or the soul) as possessing these acts such that they are recognized as our own acts. For Suárez is clear (and Heider is clear that he is) that we can only know our soul or our self as the substantial form that figures as the bearer and ultimate cause of our cognitive operation through the intellect and by inference (245). Thus, simply appealing to the soul’s causing its perceptual acts seems insufficient to provide an illuminating explanation of these perceptual acts as being equipped with any robust self-awareness.

The second philosophical problem that Heider’s book seems to leave to future research concerns the internal sense’s function of enabling the perception of unified objects with various sensory qualities. As Heider puts it: “We perceive this white man as Thaddeus and this small girl as Mary” (217). One problem one might have with respect to Suárez’s reificationist theory of perception, which construes almost all its principles as distinct res, is that it leads to a fragmentation of the mind, which in turn threatens to undermine any feasible account of perceptual unity. Since Heider himself briefly raises this worry (221, n.15; though only to dismiss it), I want to point out another problem with Suárez’s account of perceptual unity, one that results from Suárez’s strict separation of perceptual and intellectual activities in opposition to Thomas Aquinas (242–244). Given this separation, Suárez must explain how we can perceive various sensory qualities as belonging to one single substance without appealing to any intellectual input. However, it remains unclear how he could do so, given his other (already cited) view that we can only know of substances due to the intellect and its inferences. How, then, could mere perceptual acts, which are not informed by any intellectual notions, make us see these various patches of colors as this small girl, let alone as Mary?

Even though Heider does not explore these or other problems raised by Suárez’s theory of perception, this is certainly no fault of his study. On the contrary, it is only because of his excellent work that these problems can be seen and articulated so clearly. Heider’s present book provides an immensely valuable piece of scholarship, which no one working on Suárez’s philosophy of mind can justly ignore, and which I am sure is going to spark much future research on late-scholastic philosophy of mind.