Aristotle and Natural Law

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Tony Burns, Aristotle and Natural Law, Continuum, 2011, 217pp., $120.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781847065551.

Reviewed by Jacob Klein, Colgate University


Aristotle and Natural Law has two central concerns: it offers an analysis of the concept of natural law and its history, focusing especially on Greek philosophy and the sophistic debates of the fifth century, and it locates Aristotle within this history as Burns understands it. The introduction sketches an account of concepts and conceptual meaning quite generally. Chapters 1 to 3 focus selectively on passages from the Nicomachean EthicsPolitics, and Rhetoric. Chapter 4 connects Burns's account of natural law with "the nature versus convention debate," and the conclusion presents Aristotle as the "founder of a distinct natural law tradition," one that departs from the conventionalism Burns associates with the sophists, but also from the Platonic and Stoic view that nature "provides a higher standard of morality or justice which the laws of human society ought to imitate and reflect" (152). Throughout, Burns is especially concerned with the "conventionalist" interpretation of Hans Kelsen and the "naturalist" interpretation of Fred Miller, Jr. He argues that although Miller is right to regard Aristotle as a natural law theorist, he is wrong to suppose that Aristotle regards the principles of natural law as a "higher, critical standard of justice which individuals might use to evaluate positive law, or the customs and conventions of the society in which they live" (96). According to Burns, Aristotle steers a middle course, offering "a sophisticated philosophical justification of the customs and traditions associated with the constitution of any polis, no matter what they might be" (105).

It is hard to see what is sophisticated in a view that endorses the content of any and all codes of civil law, and Burns does not offer a compelling argument for these claims. On its face, such a reading contradicts the main argument of the Politics, which clearly does measure political constitutions by the standard of natural justice, a point succinctly summarized by Miller's claim that "on Aristotle's view, justice in so far as it is natural serves as a normative constraint on the politician."[1] Burns's conclusions, however, are largely unencumbered by sustained attention to Aristotle's text, and Burns is more frequently concerned to offer thumbnail sketches of broad swathes of literature from a spectrum of philosophical traditions. The introductory chapter alludes, for example, to Heidegger, Gadamer and the "hermeneutic circle," as well as to Frege, Wittgenstein and Kripke, with Kuhn and Foucault stirred breezily into the mix. Citing the later Wittgenstein, Burns suggests that there is no "closed list" of features essential to a concept and that it may not be possible "to offer a precise definition of the concept of natural law" (35). Accordingly, we are entitled to speak of "the natural law tradition despite the obvious diversity which exists in the ideas of those theorists who have, historically, employed the concept of natural law" (35). Yet this entitlement does not extend to Donald N. Schroeder, apparently, whom Burns faults, thirty pages later, for assuming "that there is just one natural law tradition" (65).

The positive core of the book is set out in Chapter 1, where Burns offers an interpretation of Nicomachean Ethics 5.7. Aristotle there distinguishes between natural (phusikon) and legal or conventional (nomikon) justice within the sphere of political justice as a whole, and he objects to those who treat the whole of political justice as merely legal or conventional. Those who defend this position do so, Aristotle observes, on the grounds that what obtains by nature is everywhere unchanging (akinêton), whereas what is just (ta dikaia) is seen to change. Though he acknowledges that what is natural is also changeable in a way (hôs), Aristotle concludes that we may nevertheless preserve a distinction between the parts of political justice that do and do not obtain by nature, and he provides an obscure but important analogy to illustrate this point: the right hand is naturally stronger than the left, but it is possible for everyone to become ambidextrous (1134b33-35).

According to Burns, Aristotle's subdivision of political justice in this passage is not intended to distinguish a sphere of political justice that is wholly natural, on the one hand, from one that is wholly conventional, on the other. Instead, each principle of political justice includes "a part which is natural and a part which is legal or conventional" (49). Burns characterizes this as a horizontal division, cutting across the sphere of political justice inasmuch as no principle of natural justice is applicable at all apart from its expression in positive civil law. The natural part of political justice embodies formal principles of natural justice (here Burns seems to forget his metaphor of horizontal bisection, treating parts of principles as principles in their own right) that forbid, e.g., murder, theft, and adultery (45). The principles of natural justice are unchangeable, Burns maintains, insofar as they have universal moral validity, and also insofar as they are actually incorporated "within the systems of political justice of all societies at all times, without exception" (61). They are changeable, on the other hand, insofar as their particular expressions in civil law may take a variety of forms.

Governing these two components of political justice, Burns argues, is Aristotle's "principle of equity," which maintains that "those who are equal in some relevant respect ought to be treated equally in (relevantly) similar circumstances" (53). So conceived, political justice comprises three "horizontal" tiers, like the layers of a cake. The middle layer includes the principles of natural justice, principles that follow deductively from the supreme principle of equity (Burns does not provide an example of such a deduction) and are true, in any case, in virtue of the meaning of the terms they employ, a view Burns attributes to Aristotle himself (48). These principles forbid absolutely action types such as murder, theft or adultery (here Burns cites EN 1107a9-14) and are incorporated, in one form or another, within the civil legislation of all societies at all times and places (here Burns cites Hegel). The principal task of legal or conventional justice, the bottom layer of the cake, is to "establish which acts are to count as acts of 'murder', 'theft' and so on" (45, 56), and, crucially, to establish "who are equals and precisely how these equals are to be treated" (63). On this account, the particular determinations of civil law control the extension and denotation of the concepts embodied by natural justice, evidently ruling some persons in and others out (70).

It is not clear how these claims hang together. Burns sometimes speaks as though the business of conventional law is to fix the content of natural law. Indeed, at one point he suggests that the principles of natural justice can only exist at all insofar as they are combined with certain principles of legal or conventional justice (62). This seems to be a metaphysical point, but it is hard to tell. The discussion is muddied considerably by Burns's simultaneous insistence that the creation of civil law is also a process ofinterpretation (Gadamer makes another appearance here, along with the hermeneutic circle). Given that "in Aristotle's opinion no positive law could possibly come into conflict with the demands that are placed upon us by [the] fundamental principle of justice" (63), and that "all such interpretations are equally legitimate when considered from the moral point of view" (70), it is not clear what is being interpreted here, or what the constraints governing such an interpretation could possibly be. After all, Burns holds that the principles of natural justice are wholly indeterminate (nonexistent?) apart from their concrete expression in civil law.

What does emerge from this discussion, however, is a clear sense of Burns's aims and methods. Burns ultimately groups Aristotle with Burke, Montesquieu, and Hegel as representatives of a conservative political tradition he finds opposed to a vaguely defined "political rationalism" and upholding, instead, whatever legal form the particular determinations of positive law may happen to take (65, 100, 174). Burns quotes Hans Kelsen approvingly on this score, agreeing that "the interpretation of natural law is the prerogative of the authorities established by positive law" and serves to "strengthen its authority" (175). Whether or not this is a coherent position (one hopes it is not Aristotle's), it is hardly an attractive synthesis of conventionalism and naturalism. It is, quite frankly, a repugnant doctrine in its own right, one that appears to license any and all forms of positive law as concrete expressions of natural justice. For all that Burns says, it appears to follow both that no principle of natural law is sufficient to establish a set of just or unjust actions in the absence of its embodiment within a particular code of positive civil law, and that any such code, at any time in place, will have the force of natural justice. This includes, as Burns makes clear, civil codes endorsing the institution of slavery (7, 90).

Subsequent chapters on the Politics and Rhetoric consist, for the most part, in a survey and dismissal of rival views. Burns's handling of Alasdair MacIntyre in Chapter 2 is typical. Burns criticizes the view, which he associates with MacIntyre, that "Aristotelian virtue ethics is an ethics without rules" (77). Though MacIntyre himself observes, in a passage Burns cites, that "natural and universal as well as conventional and local rules of justice" play a role in Aristotle's ethics, Burns does not treat this as evidence that his caricature of MacIntyre is unsubtle or unfair.[2] He treats it, instead, as evidence that MacIntyre is either inconsistent or careless (77). On the question of rules in Aristotle's ethics, Burns's own argument is less than compelling. He notes, correctly, that according to Aristotle, "for an action to be a just action, in the fullest possible sense of the term 'just', it has not only to be appropriately motivated, by the desire to act rightly, it must also be objectively right" (78). He then concludes, without further argument, that actions counting as right in the latter, minimal sense must do so in virtue of their conformity to "some rule or law" (78). But from the fact that an action is just according to some criterion external to an agent's psychology, it surely does not follow that this criterion must be a rule or law in particular. It might, for all Burns has said, consist in conformity to the judgments of an ideally rational agent, or to externally conceived reasons that interact (à la Dancy, say) holistically. An objective criterion of right action does not, by itself, entail a commitment to a rule based-ethics.

Unfortunately, this argument is characteristic of the quality of Burns's analysis throughout. His presentation of the secondary literature is frequently uncharitable and misleading. Thus McDowell's account is "cavalier" (10), and Miller "transforms Aristotle from a conservative into a radical thinker" (7). In his chapter on the Rhetoric, Burns seriously misrepresents a claim of Irwin's, presenting the view Irwin is concerned to explore and question (that the Rhetoric is not a reliable guide to Aristotle's own views) as a position Irwin straightforwardly endorses (110). Burns alludes airily to a range of contemporary positions, such as "the doctrine which today is referred to as 'moral realism.'" (47). He does not define this doctrine for his reader. Instead, he includes six parenthetical references to realists as various as Boyd and McDowell. Where he does explain contemporary positions, it is not clear that he understands them. Moral particularism turns out to be the view (here Burns cites an anthology) that "what makes actions just or unjust is . . . solely the motivation which lies behind them" (77). "To employ the terminology of modern moral philosophy," he writes, "Kant's ethics as Hegel understood it is both 'subjectivist' and 'non-cognitivist'" (79). I don't know whether it is useful to look to Hegel's reading of Kant in order to illuminate MacIntyre's reading of Aristotle, as Burns does in this passage. It is hard to see how any view could be both non-cognitivist and subjectivist, however, since subjectivism is a species of cognitivism -- at least according to modern moral philosophers.

Despite these criticisms, two positive things may be said of the book as a whole. First, it summarizes a great deal of secondary literature that bears on questions of natural law and the natural law tradition, very broadly conceived. Second, it usefully illustrates some of the difficulties discussions of natural law tend to invite. Quite apart from the political overtones the term has acquired, and which Burns evidently embraces, a remarkable plurality of views has been made to shelter under that label. Debates about the contours of natural law run a gamut of metaethical issues, including but not limited to questions of moral epistemology, voluntarism and naturalism, universalism and particularism, the distinction between positive and natural modes of law, and the differences among natural justice, natural law, and natural right. It is not clear to me what is gained by the effort to apply, to a particular historical figure, a category that requires so much clarification on so many fronts.

Readers will have other quibbles: The language is wooden ('it is arguable that' occurs again and again, usually as a substitute for argument). Greek accents are omitted throughout, and quotations from Aristotle's Greek are unreliable in any case (e.g., the mistaken quotation and transliteration from the EN on 49-50). Burns directs his reader to "see also Gauthier and Jolif in Aristotle" or "Jackson in Aristotle" (54). This is a puzzling locution, unless 'in' is inexplicably being given its Latin sense. The book's most serious drawback, however, is simply a failure to engage with Aristotle himself. The reader earnestly wishing to check Burns's interpretive claims against Aristotle's text is liable to find, instead, a thicket of references to Hegel or Grotius or Suarez, to Kelsen or Raz or Grene, or to any number of figures from a spectrum of traditions. It is frustrating to offer such a critical verdict, especially of a book that treats an important subject. But it is hard to see how such a mass of superficial allusions, shifting conclusions, and blithe dismissals of opposing views could help to illuminate Aristotle's own conceptual framework, or bring us closer to the remote and brilliant structure of his thought.

[1] Nature, Justice, and Rights in Aristotle's Politics (Oxford University Press, 1995), p. 77.

[2] After Virtue (University of Notre Dame Press, 1981), p. 150.