Aristotle and Other Platonists

Placeholder book cover

Lloyd P. Gerson, Aristotle and Other Platonists, Cornell University Press, 2005, 348pp, $49.95 (hbk), ISBN 0801441641

Reviewed by John Bussanich, University of New Mexico


Is Aristotle a Platonist? Well, maybe a 'platonist' -- to invoke that hackneyed anachronism -- but hardly the original article. Gerson argues convincingly that not only is Aristotle's philosophy deeply rooted in Plato's, but also that it is profoundly in harmony with its central principles. What makes this bold thesis worthy of consideration, even if one rejects it in the end, is that on serious reflection the familiar anti-Platonist Aristotle begins to seem a bit like a caricature. Gerson takes the "big-tent" approach to Platonism, but he does not airbrush away differences over specific philosophical claims or in sensibility between the two philosophers; nor does he press too hard vague conceptual analogies or superficial verbal connections. The inquiry is informed throughout with unsurpassed knowledge of the Platonic and Aristotelian texts and with analytical rigour that matches the best Aristotelian scholarship. What is unusual about Gerson's approach, at least as compared to the majority of Anglo-American Aristotelian scholars, is its constructive engagement with the ancient readers of Aristotle.

Gerson begins with the assumption, widely shared by Middle Platonists, Neoplatonists, and the Aristotelian commentators, that the philosophies of the two thinkers are complementary and harmonious, which is not to say that they are identical. Gerson employs this harmonist position as a provocation to reexamine the provenance and the ramifications of Aristotle's central doctrines, which, incidentally, sheds much light on Plato's philosophy and on Neoplatonism. "In working through the Aristotelian corpus with a mind open to the Neoplatonic assumption of harmony, I have found time and again that Aristotle was, it turns out, analyzing the Platonic position or making it more precise, not refuting it" (290, author's emphasis). He amply fulfills the promise that the project will yield "significant results both exegetical and philosophical" (7).

In ch. 1 Gerson unabashedly states what he thinks Platonism is. He readily admits that his schema reflects the views of ancient Platonists and, of course, of Aristotle, who read Plato's writings as part of a tradition that included Pythagoreans and Eleatics. He thus sets aside as irrelevant for his inquiry many of the themes that preoccupy current Platonic scholars, e.g. developmentalism, the aporetic dimension of the dialogues, and questions about "who speaks for Plato," in favour of providing a doctrinal map of Platonism. (He is sympathetic with Richard Rorty's view of what Platonism is, [23].) Although Gerson doesn't work up a comprehensive argument for an anti-developmentalist interpretation of Plato, those sympathetic to that unfashionable reading will find much to be pleased with. Basic to Platonism, he argues, is a top-down approach to philosophical explanation of the universe, which comprises both a systematic unity and a metaphysical hierarchy of being. Recognition of both the divine and the psychological as irreducible explanatory categories is necessary for understanding how personal happiness, aesthetic value, and cognitive states correlate with objectively real positions within the hierarchy of being (32-34). Additional features include an emphatic rejection of extreme nominalism and materialism and the acceptance of the priority of the intelligible to the sensible. Foregrounding these fundamental principles prepares the way for the detailed analyses of specific, hot-button issues like the theory of forms and the immortality of the soul, to which most readers bring deep-seated opinions. In six subsequent chapters Gerson seeks to demonstrate that the principles of Aristotle's philosophy and his central philosophical claims are consistent with Platonism. He discusses, in turn, Aristotle's exoteric writings (ch. 2), the Neoplatonic treatment of Aristotle's Categories (ch. 3), Aristotle's natural philosophy (ch. 4), psychology and epistemology (ch. 5), metaphysics (ch. 6), Aristotle and the forms (ch. 7), and ethics (ch. 8). The final chapter provides an overall assessment of the arguments in favour of Aristotle's Platonism.

Ch. 2 immediately announces the challenge posed to received scholarly opinion by the Neoplatonic harmonists, who assumed that the mostly non-extant dialogues are consistent with the extant treatises and "lectures." It is salutary, I think, to be forced at the outset to reexamine Jaeger's "strong developmentalist" thesis, according to which Aristotle's early Platonism gives way to a mature anti-Platonism, as well as Gwil Owen's opposite view. The Neoplatonists never doubted that in his early works Aristotle was committed to a science of the intelligible world and to the superiority of the contemplative life -- just as he continued to be in his later major works -- despite the fact that he rejected certain accounts of forms. Gerson makes an even stronger case for continuity between earlier and later works in chs. 3-4, which focus on the Categories and the inquiries into natural philosophy, respectively. In ch. 3 he argues that the Categories is not committed to sensibles as the only or primary substances and hence it is consistent with the early exoteric works and with the Metaphysics: "if the science of unchangeables includes the study of changeables with respect to their being, the situation of Categories within a subordinate science -- that is, the science of changeables -- is nicely accounted for according to the harmonization principle" (95). The same interpretive principle determines the approach to the Physics and the other natural treatises. Because physics concerns sensibles insofar as they are changeable, i.e. not qua being, it is compatible with metaphysics, which treats them qua being. The Neoplatonists applied the principles of Aristotle's physical science, viz. form and matter, actuality and potentiality, and the four causes, to complete a Platonic theory of nature by subsuming them under the latter's nexus of transcendent causes. Aristotelian form and matter are defined as "contributory causes" and thus subordinated to the Platonic paradigmatic cause, i.e. transcendent forms (discussed more fully later). Second, Neoplatonists identified Aristotelian matter with the receptacle and the "wandering cause" of Timeaus 47eff. and the unlimited in the Philebus. Clearly, the commentators' aim was not to reject Aristotelian natural science, but rather to show, simultaneously, its adequacy for explanations of sensible entities and events and the incompleteness of naturalistic accounts of the generation and knowledge of sensibles.

The harmonist approach to Aristotle's and Plato's psychology and epistemology occupies ch. 5, which opens with the criticism of contemporary functionalist and hylomorphist accounts of Aristotle's psychology as incomplete. The lynchpin of Gerson's argument is this: Plato, Aristotle, and the Neoplatonists agree that what is immortal in human beings is the separable intellect. "Without the separable intellect, there could be no cognition. And the reason is that cognition is essentially self-reflexive … that is, cognition is a state in which cognizable form is present in the intellect and the cognizer is aware of the presence of form in itself" (139). The Neoplatonists are quite explicit that self-reflexivity, discursive thinking, and psychic conflict require incorporeality. Gerson's use of the Neoplatonic commentators' interpretation of Aristotle's noetic theory is one of the great merits of his study. At the same time he could have said more than he does about how Aristotle's epistemology measures up when compared with contemporary theories in order to further his announced aim to "appropriate what is genuinely vital" in classical philosophy (22). Why should we find interesting Aristotle's view that theoretical thinking is cognitive identity with intelligible form (162)? And, on the exegetical side, one might wonder why this thinking without images is "exactly like the thinking that is found at the top of the divided line" (172).

The argument to support this striking conclusion is developed further in ch. 6 on Aristotle's metaphysics and theology. Following Kahn's view that "the Prime Mover is simply the formal-noetic structure of the cosmos as conscious of itself" (196), Gerson suggests that Plato's Demiurge is strikingly similar to Aristotle's God and that "what God thinks about may be justifiably understood to be nothing else but Plato's Forms correctly construed' (188). Sufficient space is lacking to argue the point here, but it seems to me doubtful that the Aristotelian program, as laid out by Gerson, would satisfy Plato or Plotinus even if it remains palatable to modern taste. To be precise, cognitive identity with 'the diagonal' or 'snubness' is not the sort of activity Platonists envisioned as the apex of human life let alone as the essential activity of the divine intellect. Yet this seems to be the very activity, suitably concentrated and intensified, that Gerson attributes to the unmoved mover: "god's thinking is just the self-reflexive thinking of theoretical science" (200). If his description is accurate, I would resist the further conclusion he draws, viz. that "the prime unmoved mover collapses into one of the functions Plato variously assigns to the Demiurge and the Form of the Good" (201). Yes, the first principles of the two philosophers occupy analogous positions in a hierarchically arranged universe, but Plato's (and the Neoplatonists') conception of divine thought contains a more overt and perhaps richer religious dimension than does Aristotle's.

Gerson presents the ontological part of the argument in a brilliant chapter on Platonic and Aristotelian forms. He adeptly applies the Neoplatonic distinction between participated and unparticipated forms to show how Plato's and Aristotle's perspectives are complementary. First, although the Platonic form as paradigmatic cause does not fit into Aristotle's theory of scientific explanation via the four causes, it is similar to Aristotle's intelligibles. Second, Aristotle's substantial form is similar to Platonic enmattered forms. This reading presents a serious challenge to the standard view of Aristotle's critique of Platonic forms. It rests securely on Gerson's argument that Platonic paradigmatic forms are not universals. What I find problematic in his account is the anemic picture we are given of transcendent forms in Plato: "the separate Forms are the eternal condition for the possibility of identity and difference or significant predication in the sensible world" (278). This characterization hardly does justice to Plato's vision of the forms at the apex of the great ascent passages in the Symposium, Phaedrus, and Republic. (Gerson's fine book on Plato, Knowing Persons, Oxford, 2003, does not fill this interpretive lacuna.)

A similar truncation of Plato's ideas occurs in the discussion of theoria and immortality. Ch. 8 on Neoplatonic ethics and on the Platonism in Aristotle's ethics admirably demonstrates the centrality of the contemplative ideal throughout the tradition. But again, the fact that in both Aristotle and Plato theoria is superior to the practical and the political life does not insure that the nature of this highest activity is the same for both thinkers. Nevertheless, Gerson effectively refutes attempts by contemporary scholars like Irwin and Nussbaum to excise Aristotle's contemplative ideal as some sort of youthful exuberance from which he recovered. Gerson's resistance to bowdlerizing the ancient texts recalls Cherniss' great refutation in 1957 of Gwil Owen's "discovery" that in the later dialogues Plato had given up transcendent forms and embraced an embryonic form of Oxford linguistic philosophy.

Aristotle's rejection of immortality for the whole soul, but acceptance of an immortal intellect (54), brings him rather close to Plato, but important differences remain, which Gerson glosses over. He argues that Platonic mind/soul-body dualism is secondary to the more basic dualism of embodied and disembodied persons (35). Unfortunately, Aristotle says nothing about disembodied existence, whereas Plato and Plotinus provide fascinating glimpses into this recondite aspect of human life. Given the often striking differences between Aristotle and the Platonists on this issue, it is not surprising that Gerson doesn't discuss passages like Phaedo 81 or the Phaedrus myth, for these and other passages, e.g., the choice of lives in the Myth of Er, make an implicit distinction between an immortal intellect and an intermediate psychic vehicle, which is the seat of the passions and which also survives the death of the body even though it is not immortal. In other words, Platonists have a good deal to say about "disembodied persons" that is not addressed by Gerson's statement that "embodied human existence has to be understood or explained in terms of intelligible ideals. Thus embodied persons are images of disembodied ideals" (35). Thus, his doubts that reincarnation is an essential part of Platonism (35n40) are unwarranted, for without this theory the entire Platonist vision of the soul's path to perfection crumbles to dust. Aristotle's refutation of reincarnation (De Anima 407b13-25) raises serious questions about how closely the two philosophers' notions of divinization can be assimilated to each other. Platonic philosophers require eons to achieve their goal, whereas Aristotelians, limited to one lifetime, apparently can reach theirs in one. How can the character of their respective goals be the same or even very similar in the face of this fundamental difference?

Despite the caveats noted this is a compelling study that deserves immediate attention from ancient philosophers who are willing to rethink these important questions. It is difficult to resist Gerson's conclusion that "if one rigorously and honestly sought to remove these [Platonic] assumptions, the 'Aristotelianism' that would remain would be indefensible and incoherent. A comprehensive and scientifically grounded anti-Platonic Aristotelianism, is, I suspect, a chimera" (290). Those aiming to refute this claim have their work cut out for them.