Aristotle on the Nature of Truth

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Christopher P. Long, Aristotle on the Nature of Truth, Cambridge University Press, 2011, 275pp., $90.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780521191210.

Reviewed by Sean Kirkland, DePaul University


"To be united with nature . . . that is the goal of all our aspirations." So writes Friedrich Hölderlin in an early preface to his Hyperion. Indeed, Greek tragedy has for him a privileged status among art forms precisely because it depicts so successfully this fundamental human alienation from nature and the consuming desire it provokes. After laboring for years to write a modern tragedy, Hölderlin came to distinguish the mode in which the ancients responded to this alienated condition from the mode in which we late-moderns or "Hesperians" might do so. The Greek tragic hero or heroine ultimately brings about the desired unification with nature through a complete dissolution of the self -- Empedocles' spectacular self-immolating leap into the volcano is for Hölderlin exemplary of the ancient mode. By contrast, in the modern era, the presumptive means by which this tear in our world might be mended is no longer self-annihilating passion, but reason and the abstraction of the concept. Opposing this pervasive tendency, Hölderlin suggests that we must learn to properly endure our separation from nature, rather than seek to overcome it. Our every thought and action must bear the trace of that human finitude which results from the always only partial accessibility and graspability of the world around us.

I submit that Christopher P. Long's Aristotle on the Nature of Truth is a call for just such an Hölderlinean endurance (rather than any elimination) of the irremediable remoteness that belongs to nature, even its prior self-presentation to us. That is, Long's book is a call "to cultivate a habit of thinking capable of doing justice to the many ways that being is said without naively denying that something is also always withheld in the manifold expressions of being" (13). Interestingly, if more problematically, it is in the ancient texts of Aristotle that Long finds a paradigm for this mode of responding to our exilic condition, a mode that was for Hölderlin a possibility unique to the late-modern period.

Speaking quite straightforwardly before immersing ourselves in the book's own idiosyncratic vocabulary, we might say that Long makes three basic claims in these chapters. 1.) The relationship between human being and its world is not that of a subject set over against and potentially completely cut off from objects. Rather, the things of the world are always already presenting themselves to us, and in so doing things allow themselves to be understood and grasped even as they partly withhold themselves from us, denying our efforts to know or master them completely. Long speaks here of our fundamental relation to the world as a "dynamic transaction, which, strictly speaking, is prior to the analytic distinction between subject and object, [and which] is quite literally onto-logical: it is the site of the encounter between to on and ho logos, between being and articulation" (18). 2.) Given this, 'truth' as it applies to this more original condition must be something quite different from and prior to the traditional conception thereof, i.e., the correspondence between a given present reality and its accurate re-presentation in thought or speech. Long defines truth as cooperative (47), dialogical (25), symbiotic (48), and even as a form of justice (243), all of which indicate, on the one hand, that truth is constituted by the interaction of human thought or saying and the things thought or said, and that, on the other hand, discord or at least difference could be proper to that truthful interaction. And, finally, 3.) If read in a certain light, we can find both 1.) and 2.) at work in Aristotle's texts.

This makes for an original and compelling interpretation of Aristotle. Again and again, and often in very unlikely or out of the way locations in the Aristotelian oeuvre, Long is able to uncover indications of this unorthodox ontology/epistemology. His command of Aristotle's texts is impressive throughout. And it must be said that Long admirably refuses to shy away from those themes that might seem to resist his unconventional vision (e.g., in De anima the apparent emphasis on the passivity of perception and thought, in the Metaphysics the ideal of pure energeia as exemplified in the unmoved mover's thinking/being, and in De interpretatione Aristotle's privileging of apophantic speech and his discussion of the relation between things and language).

For Long, the world's irremediable partial inaccessibility results from what he refers to as the "unicity" of things, their concrete singularity. For this is an aspect of each thing that as such exceeds our knowledge of it, knowledge apparently relating per se to the eidos or morphê, the 'form' of the thing, when universalized by being abstracted from its brute materiality (Meta. VII.1035b34-1036a9, VII.1039b27-1040a27). This fundamental recalcitrance entails that a truthful relation to things, or as Long would have it, a truthfully responsive saying of things, must somehow hold within it a certain "stillness" (34), a self-limitation that reflects the essentially unknowable or unsayable aspect of things. It should be noted, however, that Long does not argue for this claim. Instead, he takes for patently clear the "paradoxical ways things show themselves" (1) and "the concrete phenomenon of singularity that announces itself in each ontological encounter" (2). Indeed, he even refers to "the natural fact that things speak, that being expresses itself" (12) and that, in so doing, "something [their unicity] is always also withheld in the manifold expressions of things" (13). Beginning then from this claim about the way things appear, Long presents Aristotle as one who recognizes it as well and who, as a result, attempts to think and speak at the limit of what is thinkable and sayable: "Aristotle's thinking too is alive to singularity, uncertainty, and ambiguity, even as it feels the pull of order and stability" (16).

Indeed, in its task of offering an interpretation of Aristotle, Long's text does not proceed primarily by way of argumentation. Rather, Long presents what might be understood as illuminating reiterations of Aristotle. He focuses on Aristotle's treatments of selected issues (language, voice, perceiving/thinking, natural beings, and the being of the divine, each of which receives a chapter), and in the passages addressing these issues Long believes he can make evident the sensitivity to singularity mentioned above and the radically challenged notion of truth that must accompany it. Throughout, Long simply restates what is said in these passages, using a terminology he constructs partly through non-traditional and sometimes more literal translations of the Greek and partly from the independent philosophical terminology he draws from Heidegger and certain American philosophers. Long clearly hopes that the passages in question will thereby be released from obscuring and anachronistic presuppositions and that they will come to say for the reader more or less self-evidently what he is claiming they say.

By noting this lack of argument, my intention is not to be critical. Indeed, this belongs necessarily to the phenomenological or "legomenological" mode of thinking to which this book's readers are being called and, indeed, which the book is finding already in Aristotle's texts. Long's philosophical task here is not, for instance, to identify an indubitable premise or premises on which to build an airtight deduction in order to arrive at scientific certainty. Rather, his task is the clarification of what is already appearing in these passages, an interpretation of what these passages are already saying to us. Indeed, it is precisely this project and the means by which it is most naturally achieved that leads to a sense of beginning again and again in media res. As an existential phenomenologist and a hermeneutical thinker, one begins always in the middle of (the appearing) of things and tries to respond properly to these in their appearing. There is simply no need to ground one's thinking by establishing a prior certainty about one's subject matter. I would have liked to see Long make this aspect of his method itself a theme for reflection, indicating its merits and limitations, and bringing his reader to a more fundamental awareness thereof. But in any case, the internally consistent character of Long's project is praiseworthy -- he practices the mode of thinking to which he (by way of his Aristotle) is calling his readers. Long is saying Aristotle's thinking differently, but this "saying" is neither a subsequent element applied to Aristotle nor does it presume to constitute Aristotle's thought utterly. Rather, just like everything else in our world, Aristotle's thought says itself to us in ways that demand response, and in his mode of responding (a mode that departs quite dramatically from much of what the tradition says), Long hopes to bring Aristotle's thought to light more according to its own mode of appearing.

Long's reiterations of Aristotle proceed by strategic substitutions of the terminology of traditional scholarship, gaining him and his readers a new perspective on the Aristotelian text. These terminological innovations are numerous, but let's just look at two of the most important phrases: "the saying of things" and "ecological justice."

Throughout these chapters (even sometimes when it seems awkward or gratuitous) one reads the "saying of things" (1), rather than any of the more standard ways in which one might refer to language and what it refers to. Indeed, as Long notes in the preface, The Saying of Things was the original title of Long's book. This phrase allows Long to circumvent the problematic question of how language relates to reality -- he does not need to establish whether language is a secondary epiphenomenon taking its structures and elements from the world of our experience or whether it instead constitutes that very world, dictating those structures itself and determining the elements by allowing them to be named and thus identified. Capitalizing on the ambiguity between the subjective and objective genitive in the phrase "the saying of things," Long is able to indicate both that language is nothing other than the bringing to light of the world and that the world is not separable from its appearing to us in language and is, thus (at least partly), sayable, intelligible, knowable. In this, I believe Long finds his way back to an Aristotelian way of thinking, which precedes an exclusively modern set of problems. Many apparent interpretive issues resolve themselves simply through Long's insistent use of this phrase.

"Ecological justice" is Long's phrase for what is required of us by the appearing of things, or by what he calls the "ontological encounter" (11). As noted above, Long wants to render the basic appearing of things in terms of a 'saying'. That is, in appearing to us, things present themselves intelligibly, they address us, and they demand a proper response. Indeed, they demand that we enter into conversation with them, by saying them according to their ways of appearing to us. If it were not for that "recalcitrant remainder" (20), their unicity or concrete material singularity, we could perhaps imagine that we were responding properly by accurately putting together universals into a predicative statement ('S is P'). However, in order to say as well the withdrawal of the singular thing from our saying, a more sophisticated notion of truth is required. That is, we must attempt to say the thing in its emerging into and in its withholding itself from intelligibility at the site where we dwell together with it and with one another, which is to say, at the oikos or 'home, dwelling place' (the root of the 'eco-' in 'ecological'). Only by saying the thing in its mode of appearing at this site do we say it truthfully, i.e., we do the thing ecological justice. Setting aside a whole host of epistemological issues, Long's terminology here powerfully illuminates (and his discussion thereof explains and deepens) the strange sense of responsibility to things of which philosophical thinking is only the most acute symptom (think here of thaumazein at Meta. I.982b11-24). And it is precisely by departing fairly dramatically from the usage of Aristotle, for whom 'justice' seems fairly strictly assigned to the political register (EN V.1029a4-1038b10, and Pol. I.1253a37-39) and for whom the term 'ecology' does not exist, that I believe Long gives us some insight into the way in which Aristotle must have conceived the human confrontation with the world, prior to the severing of subject from object, of language from world.

As has likely become clear, I am sympathetic to Long's finding in Aristotle's texts such a radical phenomenological, hermeneutic philosophical project. And a number of Long's discussions of specific themes are especially illuminating (the discussion of the Aristotelian method of dialektikê as phenomenological in chapter 3 and Long's attempt to find a hermeneutic dynamic in perception in chapter 5 are particularly strong, in my opinion). I mentioned at the outset that there are also passages that resist Long's interpretation. We might note just one example of this. In his reiteration of the oft-cited passage from book I of the Politics (Pol. I.1253a15-18), where the fundamental human possession of the logos is connected to the ability to say what appears as beneficial and harmful, just and unjust in one's polis, Long wants to hear Aristotle saying that because we are beings addressed by the saying of things (i.e., we have logos), we are compelled to say those things truthfully or in their mode of appearing (i.e., do them justice). This amounts to a somewhat misleading restatement of Aristotle's Greek, indeed even a mistranslation. For Long renders Aristotle's ho de logos epi tô(i) dêloun esti as "logos is . . . that on the basis of which something appears" (92). He thereby makes the article of the articular infinitive that the preposition is governing (tô(i) dêloun) function as a relative pronoun. The more obvious reading would be, "But the logos is toward/for the purpose of making clear [the beneficial and the harmful, the just and the unjust]." This difference is important, for the passage properly rendered does not describe logos as a ground out of which a sense for justice arises and becomes clear, but as a tool that is in its very being somehow "toward" the political function of making these issues clear.

In the end, Long should have done more here to introduce his reader to his unorthodox method and vocabulary, perhaps by drawing explicit oppositions to traditional tactics and terms, by identifying the standard interpretive problems his method resolves, and by pointing to the desirable ends it brings about. Not taking the trouble to do this when departing fairly radically from traditional approaches, will result in preaching to a small unorthodox choir. Indeed, a choir that might just be understanding one's meaning at a merely superficial level. Indeed, I found myself nodding along often, but a greater depth of insight would have been achieved, I believe, had he included some more contextualizing methodological reflections and had he occasionally upset the flowing repetition of his own terminology to relate the concepts at stake in more conventional language. That being said, I endorse very strongly the ultimate aim of Long's book, that of breaking Aristotle free of a calcified and often obscuring traditional vocabulary in order to find there an original thinker who addresses his world in part prior to some of the fundamental conceptual oppositions that subsequently came to dominate and constrain Western philosophy.