Aristotle and the Philosophy of Friendship

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Pangle, Lorraine Smith, Aristotle and the Philosophy of Friendship, Cambridge, 2003, 264pp, $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 0521817455.

Reviewed by Gabriel Richardson Lear , University of Chicago


From an Aristotelian point of view it is tempting to think that friendship can show us something important about moral virtue since it is in this context that generosity, courage, and selflessness come most easily. It is also in friendship that people feel most fulfilled, and so it is tempting to think that by studying friendship we can see how the life of moral virtue and happiness come together. In her study of the discussion of friendship in Books VIII and IX of the Nicomachean Ethics, Lorraine Smith Pangle argues that Aristotle begins with these high-minded hopes in order to show something quite different to those who are willing to think carefully (i.e. not necessarily to everyone who will read or hear the argument, e.g. p.131, p.235 n.10). Pangle thinks that the idea that virtue is most perfectly and easily realized in friendship, though true in its way, most likely rests on a confused understanding both of moral virtue and of the goodness of friends. According to Pangle, the decent people Aristotle addresses are likely to think that friendship is good because it is fulfilling to devote ourselves utterly to another person and because they think moral virtue involves precisely this readiness for self-sacrifice in the expectation of honor. She argues that Aristotle’s purpose in NE VIII and IX is to correct these misconceptions in a way that shows that true virtue and the best friendship arise among people who do not seek their happiness in either. Instead, it is the friendships of philosophers that best exemplify virtue in friendship. Thus, the books on friendship form a bridge to Aristotle’s argument in the final book of the Nicomachean Ethics that philosophical contemplation is the most perfect happiness. This project unfolds in the course of an astonishingly complex account of friendship: not only does Aristotle discuss friendships based on virtuous character, he also describes relationships based on utility or pleasure as defective, but nevertheless genuine, friendships. Friendships between peers are standard, but he also spends several chapters discussing what he calls friendships based on a superiority, such as between parents and children, rich and poor, rulers and subjects. He explains why friends get into fights, when friendships dissolve, why friendship is necessary, and what is its relationship to self-love.

Pangle’s project is, therefore, ambitious. She develops her argument about the deeper purpose of Aristotle’s theory of friendship in the context of offering a chapter-by-chapter interpretation of the text. Furthermore, she augments her analysis with lengthy discussions of Plato’s Lysis, Montaigne’s “Of Friendship”, and Cicero’s Laelius (as well as a briefer discussion of Bacon’s “Of Friendship”), all of which she sees as posing illuminating alternatives to the position Aristotle develops. The result is a book that is full of fascinating discussions, not all of which directly advance her central argument. However, I am not persuaded by her claim that Aristotle’s account of friendship does or is intended to devalue the public, political life in favor of a life devoted to philosophy. Before I raise an objection to that argument, though, I want to mention her interpretation of the importance of pleasure for friendship. For Pangle’s book is full of insightful suggestions about Aristotle’s text and the topic of friendship more generally.

One of the most persistent questions about Aristotle’s account of friendship is to what extent a person’s appreciation of his friend must be self-interested. Pangle argues that although all Aristotelian friendship involves an element of self-interest, a friend on account of virtue is able to love the other for two reasons: as beneficial and as good simpliciter. This, she says, is likely what Aristotle has in mind when he points out that virtuous people are both good for each other and good in themselves (38). Unfortunately, he is vague about the connection between these two sources of love. But he does explain the respect in which virtuous friends are pleasant to each other: since each is virtuous, each delights in observing virtue. Virtue is, after all, fine and beautiful (kalon), and, according to Aristotle, the experience of the fine is a particular sort of pleasure. But in being pleased by the friend’s virtue, one is delighting in the other for what he is in himself. “Perhaps, then, Aristotle is hinting at the intriguing possibility that it is through our openness to pleasure and not in our need for what is good that we come closest to cherishing another simply for what he is in himself” (44).

Once we see the importance of pleasure in the best friendships, we can understand in part why Aristotle holds pleasure friendship in such relatively high regard. The pleasure that is the basis of such friendship is the pleasure the friends take in being together. (Aristotle’s chief examples of pleasure friends are teenaged companions.) And even though a pleasure friend’s attachment is not to the other’s character, it nevertheless seems closer to this ideal than the attachment of a utility friend. Pangle does not speculate why this is so. The most she will say is that grounding pleasure friendships in pleasure “is perhaps not quite the same as to say that they love not the other person but only their own pleasure, and regard the other person merely as a container or vehicle for it” (46). She also shows that Aristotle’s reluctance to call associates of utility “friends” is based not on their lack of goodwill but in their failure to be mutually pleasant (55). Pangle does not have time to develop these ideas in much detail and a full defense of the position, if it is in fact Aristotle’s view, would require a discussion of his account of pleasure and its necessary connection to its object. But if she is right, this is another place where Aristotle acknowledges the very important place of pleasure in our lives without claiming that pleasure itself is the good.

Pangle’s argument about the relationship of friendship to the philosophical life comes in two parts. In the last three chapters of her book she interprets Aristotle as arguing, among other things, that friendship, and in particular friendship between unequals, is desirable for the best person because he loves his own existence and, in helping a kindred spirit engage in significant and satisfying activity, he extends or realizes his own existence (162). Since human existence, according to Aristotle, is essentially in activity, the question becomes which joint activity is most suitable for friendship? Looking ahead to an argument Aristotle makes in NE X.7, Pangle argues that activity that looks morally noble from the benefactor’s point of view is in fact not ideal. It arises in contexts of necessity that no sensible person would choose (164). Furthermore, Pangle thinks it unlikely that any such action ever in fact feels most worth choosing at the moment of action (165). Much to be preferred, she claims, are “the engaging discussions of teacher and student that educate the student while pushing the teacher to greater clarity” (167). Thus it emerges that the best friendships, those between people who most clearly understand the nature of human life and the value of moral virtue, will be friendships between philosophers.

Although the last step of her argument is a little quick, Pangle is probably right that by putting the emphasis of his account on the activity friends share, Aristotle opens the door to evaluating friendships on the basis of the things particular friends do together. Thus, an intuitive high regard for friendship need not undermine the claim of the philosophical life to be the happiest, but may actually support it.

But it is an important aspect of Pangle’s interpretation that this part of Aristotle’s account comes after a sustained attack on the political life in NE VIII.7-IX.3. The idea is that by the time we get to the end of Aristotle’s discussion of unequal friendships and quarrels between friends, we will be ready for a new conception of happiness and of friendship (137, 235 n.10).

She begins this first part of her argument in Chapter 3, when she turns to the discussion of unequal friendships in NE VIII.7-8. Briefly, her argument proceeds as follows: Since the inferior partner in an unequal friendship can never make an equal return for the benefits he receives, the problem for Aristotle is to figure out how such inequality can in a sense be equalized. Aristotle’s solution is that the inferior reciprocates by loving more than he is loved and in proportion to the superiority of his friend. Loving here cannot mean actively doing well by the superior friend since if the inferior could do that, he wouldn’t be inferior. Rather, Aristotle must mean that the inferior feels greater affection and expresses that affection in open admiration or honor of the superior. No doubt Aristotle’s solution is odd, but Pangle believes he undermines it almost as soon as he suggests it. In cases of not too great disparity and for a short time, the inferior’s greater affection may create the illusion of sufficient equality. But over time, Pangle claims, this fiction becomes impossible to maintain. Thus, “[t]he equalization effected by giving greater affection in response to greater merit can at best work only at the margins, to correct relatively small differences in merit between friends” (58). The upshot of Pangle’s interpretation is that, despite what people may think and what Aristotle himself initially suggests, greater affection cannot equalize permanently unequal friendships, such as between father and child, husband and wife (according to Aristotle) and a virtuous political leader and his fellow citizens.

There are two interlocking reasons, according to Pangle, why Aristotle thinks equalization via the greater affection of the inferior cannot genuinely equalize an unequal friendship. First, he believes that honor has no intrinsic value and so it cannot possibly repay what the superior has given (60). Second, any superior who benefited his friend in the expectation of honor would not actually deserve it (127). So a political leader or other “superior who was entirely satisfied with the equalization Aristotle describes would seem to show poor judgement” (61) and, if not positively ignoble, would not be as noble as he pretended.

Pangle does not intend to argue that genuine civic friendship between those of unequal status and character is impossible. However, a clear-sighted superior will see virtue as its own reward and will find an equal return not in what he receives from the inferior but in the self-realization he achieves through him (198).1 Crucially, Pangle believes, such a person would not see political life and the exercise of virtue with respect to one’s fellow-citizens as the locus of happiness. He might value his acts of civic generosity as moments of virtuous activity, but virtue that was entirely satisfactory and worth choosing in itself could usually be more easily exercised in private life (132). Furthermore, once the value of honor is seen to be negligible, there is nothing to be gained from political life per se that is worth devoting a life to (130). Thus, Pangle believes, if we are attuned to the incoherence just below the surface of Aristotle’s account of unequal friendships, we will be primed for the new account of the happy life that Aristotle presents in NE X.7.

Pangle is surely right that, according to Aristotle, the good of friendship is in some sort of activity of self-realization rather than in the return of love and honor one receives. But I am not convinced that the theory of equalization Aristotle describes in NE VIII.7 is so confused as she suggests. Her interpretation of VIII.7-8 appears to be at odds with later passages in which Aristotle seems to rely on the very theory of equalization Pangle says he marginalizes. To take but one example, he says in NE VIII.13 that “equal friends must be equal in loving and in other respects, as their equality requires, but unequals must repay in proportion to the superiorities involved” (1162b2-4).

Recall that in her interpretation (1) honor has no intrinsic value and so cannot possibly repay what a superior has given and (2) any superior who benefits his friend in the expectation of honor does not deserve it. (2) is based on the claim that no one who acts in the expectation of honor is truly noble or deserving of it (127), but I doubt that Aristotle would agree. After all, he calls the great-souled man – whose virtue is to demand honor as an appropriate return for his moral greatness – an “ornament” of virtue. Pangle wonders whether this glowing picture of the great-souled man was “flattery” (60). We might like to see the great-souled man taken down a peg, but I suspect this shows only that the virtuous person’s self-consciousness as morally beautiful is an aspect of Aristotle’s ethics that is most alien to our own understanding of moral motivation. So there is little reason to think that, according to Aristotle, a person’s interest in honor disqualifies him for it.

As for (1), her case that Aristotle demotes the value of honor in this passage is not clear-cut. It depends on reading him as saying that since most people desire honor, but not being-loved, for merely instrumental reasons, honor in fact is only instrumentally valuable. Furthermore, the instrumental value most people attribute to it – it is a sign of the favor of powerful people and, when it comes from good people, it is a confirmation of one’s own goodness – could not possibly be of interest to someone virtuous. It is worth pointing out that Aristotle never affirms the merely instrumental value of honor in his own voice and, as Pangle says, earlier in the NE he claims that it is worth choosing for its own sake. It also is not clear to me that the second instrumental benefit of honor is so negligible to a good person as Pangle suggests.

But let us suppose that honor is only instrumentally valuable and in such a way that the virtuous person will have no need of it. How does this show that being-loved is not adequate recompense to a superior? Aristotle’s point in mentioning the common assessment of honor as only instrumentally valuable is to distinguish it from being-loved: the latter is thought to be more precious since it is intrinsically valuable. He does not explain what this further benefit is, but given the view of equalization he has described in VIII.7, there is reason to think that it can be sufficient repayment to a superior, as Pangle herself admits (61). True, Aristotle does go on to argue that loving, rather than being loved, is the virtue of friends. But this claim does not degrade the power of the inferior’s greater love to equalize the relationship. In fact, it might be thought to support that claim. Aristotle may be saying that our success in friendship is to be measured not by the extent and quality of affection we receive but in the extent and appropriateness of the affection we give. When the inferior loves in proportion to the merit of his superior friend, he is a good and, more to the point, as good a friend as is the superior. “Since friendship consists more in loving, and lovers of friends are praised, loving seems to be the virtue of friends. As a result, those for whom this corresponds to worth are stable friends, and their friendship is stable. It is in this way that unequals, too, would best be friends, since then they would be equalized” (1159a33-b2, my emphasis). The fact that loving is the virtue of friends in no way suggests that being-loved is not to be treasured. Nor does it show that a person who accepts the greater love of the inferior as sufficient to equalize his superiority in active goodwill is necessarily insecure or a lover of flatterers.

So not only does Aristotle seem untroubled by a superior who is generous in the expectation of (though not for the sake of) honor, there is reason to think that, in his view, greater affection and honoring can be an equalizing return.

But there may be a deeper issue here. I suspect we can share Aristotle’s intuition that stable friendship requires a more or less equal give and take and that, where this is strictly speaking impossible, some other form of equalization must be found. But it is worth wondering why, in Aristotle’s view, equality is a sine qua non of friendship.

When she is drawing our attention to what she sees as the incoherence at the heart of most unequal friendships, Pangle talks as if the return given by the inferior is what makes the superior’s efforts on behalf of the inferior “worth it” to him (e.g. 130). If this is the correct interpretation, then it would indeed seem likely that only honor-lovers would actively pursue unequal friendships. The honor they expect would motivate them to acts of generosity. From here it is easy to suspect superior friends of hypocrisy: as friends they claim to benefit the inferior for his own sake, but their demand for honor reveals that they were really after their own good all along (131).

But when Pangle first introduces the topic of unequal friendships, she suggests another rationale for making equality a requirement. Since the primary pleasure of friendship is the pleasure of spending time with a kindred spirit, equality is especially important to the pleasure of friendship and thus to friendship itself (p.57). More needs to be said in defense of this suggestion since it is not clear why equality of reciprocation is necessary for seeing another person as a kindred spirit. Is her thought that unless two people reciprocate equally they cannot see themselves as sufficiently similar to take pleasure in spending time together? Aristotle may well believe this, and it would be worth knowing to what extent the position can be justified. We would also want to know why equalization seems so particularly important in utility friendships where, Aristotle claims, very little pleasure is to be had.

Notice, though, that if this suggestion is correct, the requirement that the inferior make an equal return or honor and affection need not cast a shadow over the superior’s benevolence. For according to this interpretation, the inferior’s return of honor is necessary not to ensure that the superior gets something out of the relationship, but to enable him to see the inferior as a kindred spirit. This sympathy and sense of similarity, once in place, is the origin of goodwill (47-50). Thus, receiving the inferior’s praises would not be the superior’s goal in being generous, but rather the condition that makes friendship (rather than some other factor) the reason to be generous on any given occasion.

Contrary to what Pangle suggests (129-130), this is consistent with Aristotle’s observation in NE VIII.14 that insufficient honor is a cause for complaint in unequal friendships. Honor in proportion to merit is not only a prerequisite of unequal friendship, after all, it is a demand of justice. When a person suspects his so-called friends are not even treating him justly, he will indeed begin to question whether they are friends at all.

But although I am not persuaded that unequal friendship and, in particular, political friendship on Aristotle’s account is so deeply confused as Pangle suggests, she is surely right that Aristotle believes it often in fact is. Where there is confusion in unequal friendships there is likely to be confusion in these people’s reciprocations with their equal friends. She is eloquent on the absurdity into which competition over the noble may fall (124). Recognizing these possible contradictions is essential to developing an account of the true value of friendship and of the Aristotelian political life. There is much in Pangle’s book that will help philosophers do just that.


1. Pangle does not think Aristotle ever develops a conception of moral virtue that is thoroughly satisfying in itself in the NE (226, n.7).