Aristotle and the Rediscovery of Citizenship

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Susan D. Collins, Aristotle and the Rediscovery of Citizenship, Cambridge University Press, 2006, 193pp., $70.00 (hbk), ISBN 0521860466.

Reviewed by Thomas W. Smith, Villanova University


Susan Collins seeks a renewed conception of citizenship through an investigation of Aristotle's political philosophy. This is necessary, she argues, because liberal political theory has failed to reckon with the fact that the human good has an unavoidable political dimension. Liberal theorists often flee from the fact that every political community "requires specific virtues, molds characters, and shapes its citizens' vision of the good" (2). Their deferral of the question, "What is good for us to be and do?" leads not merely to a kind of self-righteous blindness to the ways in which liberalism shapes the public and private lives of its citizens. It also eviscerates liberalism's ability to respond to the challenge of "creedal and salvationist religions" (166) which in their more vociferous forms argue that liberalism is morally bankrupt. So we need a more capacious understanding of the seriousness and nobility of citizenship, along with a sense of its proper limits.

The book can be divided into two parts. The first articulates the problematic character of various liberal conceptions of citizenship and argues persuasively that the anemia of these conceptions flows from the unwillingness to undertake a systematic investigation of the question, "What is good for human beings?" The second part is a sustained commentary on Aristotle's Nicomachean Ethics and Politics. Collins argues that this turn to Aristotle is defensible precisely because he does not begin from liberal presuppositions (2). Insofar as he presents an argument about the human good and its relationship to political life, he adds something essential to our debate over the meaning of citizenship that liberalism needs but cannot supply.

The author's patient, thoughtful and articulate investigation of contemporary liberal political philosophy is the best part of the book. Increasingly, she points out, liberalism has called into question "its own principles of justice and morality" (9). For example, critics sympathetic to liberalism have picked apart the Rawlsian emphasis on procedural liberalism and justice as fairness. They have eviscerated the liberal pretension to neutrality. They have criticized the hard distinction between a public realm informed by liberal principles and a private realm unaffected by the social and political forces liberalism generates. Collins thinks that these sorts of arguments have brought clarity about the need to confront the question of the human good in our regime. Yet this clarity challenges liberalism at its core. Increasingly liberal theorists recognize that liberalism requires civic education in certain virtues. However, with certain prominent exceptions, they are unwilling to argue that liberalism ought to try to transform their citizens' comprehensive views or cultivate a way of life. Aristotle can rescue us from this bind because his account of civic education faces unapologetically the fact that regimes form citizens. At the same time he argues that the highest human good is distinct from the political good, and so requires an ironic appreciation of the limits of citizen virtue.

Collins says that Aristotle does not take his bearings from "the requirements of politics or the common good simply" (41-2). Rather, moral action is understood by the political community as "good for the one who performs it" as well (42). The law serves both the common good and the desire to make citizens noble and good (44). Collins argues that citizens are especially attracted to to kalon, which she translates as "the noble." She focuses her treatment of moral virtue almost exclusively on courage. In war the welfare of the entire community is at stake. This justifies the risk of death in battle. Why would such an action be in my interest, however? Devotion to the noble, Collins argues, involves an act of sacrifice or self-forgetting (53). It involves dedication to moral virtue, understood as in part distinct from our own interests (54). She says, "In performing a noble deed, the courageous human being is shown to perform a deed that is at once selfless, in being for the sake of a higher end, and self-regarding, in being for the sake of his own virtue" (57). This tension in moral virtue leads to a kind of crisis. In the absence of resources that would allow him to remain active in virtue, the virtuous person is idle. The problem inherent in moral virtue is this: the "means to the greatest scope of noble action are open only to the tyrant" (64). Yet justice -- fairness to the community -- precludes such an outcome. Longing for the noble leads us to a situation in which moral virtue requires us to both become tyrants, and to shy away from that tyranny.

Collins pursues this point further in her subsequent discussion of justice. Here she argues that it is impossible to reconcile the requirements of the common good with the dedication to one's own perfection in virtue (68). She says, "Justice as a mean is not defined in relation to our good or perfection, but in terms of a principle of equality that establishes what is equal and fair in relation to the common good and that accords with the equality constituting the 'regime'" (69). The common good and our own perfection are dichotomous (73). In fact, particular justice is necessarily defined "by a standard other than the good condition of an individual with respect to moral virtue" (78). The problem is not simply that civic education cannot reach out for the perfection of the human good in philosophy. It cannot even reconcile the tensions within moral virtue itself fully (80).

The question of the good life must be recast in light of these realizations. Law educates, and indeed, coerces, citizens in light of its efforts to promote virtue for the sake of the community. Yet again, virtue requires power in order to be active. Since law forbids us to acquire political power unjustly, and we need power to be active in virtue, those who love virtue are never wholly satisfied if they are subordinated to law (115). Aristotle recasts the human good in light of this problem by arguing that the longing for self-sufficient activity is completed in the life of philosophy, which suddenly appears as the highest human good (116). Yet the life of philosophy is antithetical to political life, in part because while law needs its wisdom, law's authority cannot tolerate wisdom as a competing authority (117). While noble, political life is an impediment to one's well-being in several respects (146). For the citizen who wishes for rule to afford him the opportunity to exercise virtue, the constraint associated with the demands of the common good will chafe. Indeed, in certain cases, ostracism is the right course of action for the community to protect its advantage from the claims of superior virtue. In short, "no regime can accommodate the common advantage in the full sense: the advantage of the whole city -- of every member who contributes to its existence and end -- and the advantage of those who, as citizens, merit ruling and being ruled in turn" (141). In addition, those who are devoted to the philosophic life are also constrained by the demands of politics. Collins says that political life is an "impediment to one's own well-being" for the philosopher (146).

Collins' response to the difficulties of citizenship is found in her explication of wittiness. Humor can "liberate a person from the conventions laid down by the lawgiver" (158). To laugh at a convention is to be liberated from it. Both citizens and philosophers have a shared interest in cultivating this liberation. Citizens do because the political community cannot reconcile the tensions within the moral virtues it seeks to promote. Philosophers do, because philosophy is associated with liberation from convention (162). "As part of moral virtue that points beyond the political life, wittiness occupies the middle ground between a dogmatic commitment to the law and skeptical alienation from it" (163). In its moderation, it pays respect to the attractiveness and seriousness inherent in the devotion to the noble. However, it still is able to laugh at convention when it claims to cultivate the whole human good. In sum, wittiness avoids the Scylla of cosmopolitan indifference to community virtue and the Charybdis of parochial and dogmatic patriotism.

Those familiar with the Straussian approach to political philosophy should be able to anticipate the conclusion of Collins' argument, although not its course, which is often very clever. One could question several of her interpretations of Aristotle. One focus of the argument, for example, is that moral virtue requires material to be active, and so tends to tyranny. However, Aristotle says explicitly that "we can do noble acts without ruling earth and sea" because what we actually need for such actions is not excessive (see Nicomachean Ethics X.8.1179a 1-15; also Politics VII.3.1325b1-5). Further, Collins asserts several times that the common good is against our individual interests (e.g. 109). If so, it is not clear what Aristotle's repeated use of the term "common" could mean. What would seem to be required here is a detailed investigation of Aristotle's discussion of the various meanings of the term philia as well as an explication of Aristotle's insistence that philia is connected to justice (e.g., NE VII.1.1155a25). The best kind of friends are "other selves" for Aristotle. Could an analogous relationship apply among fellow citizens or not? Unfortunately, Collins does not dwell on Aristotle's discussion of philia. Finally, for Aristotle, wittiness is the mean between boorishness and buffoonery, not necessarily between cosmopolitan cynicism about politics and patriotic moralism. In any case, it is not clear that comedy rightly understood can provide a public basis for reconsideration of what she takes to be our anemic conceptions of citizenship. Her argument is that the problems of liberal citizenship demand a compelling account of the human good. So the important issue is not whether her discussion of wittiness is true to Aristotle. It is whether it is capable of providing a publicly compelling solution to the problem she sets.

Since to quibble over the possible meanings of texts from Aristotle is to invite disagreements about hermeneutical strategies, it is helpful to articulate those strategies. One is the assertion of a definite meaning of a term, and the subsequent employment of that term in a univocal way. This consistently univocal use of terms generates tensions, contradictions, and dichotomies that might not otherwise appear if terms were employed in more subtle ways. In the most important case, Collins translates the term "to kalon" as "the noble," defining it as a self-sacrificing devotion to moral virtue. Yet this stacks the deck in favor of her critique of moral virtue and thus her subsequent argument about the problems of common life. If "the noble" means self-sacrifice for moral virtue, then by definition, moral virtue can never be completely in our interest, even though the community needs it. Another compelling translation of to kalon is, "the beautiful." Often, we are simply attracted to what is beautiful, and describe people's actions in this way. What is beautiful does not always demand sacrifice, however, yet Collins consistently makes the hard case of courage the central case for her articulation of the problems with moral virtue. Could her account hold for other virtues she does not discuss, such as temperance or generosity? Regardless, let us explore the problem of courage and beauty briefly. The Union defenders on Cemetery Ridge famously looked out at Pickett's troops crossing the Gettysburg farmland and wondered at their beauty. What questions do we have to ask to wrestle adequately with this strange experience? Can it be in our interest to engage in a beautiful act, even if we risk harm in other respects? How can we understand the implications of our attraction to different kinds of beauty, especially if we are attracted in the face of danger? Is an attraction to beautiful actions that arises in political life related positively to the desire for the good, and so even to a life of philosophy? What is the relationship of beauty to the good, anyway? Are there analogical extensions of the term "to kalon" that might help us understand what this experience means? Or must the term be used in a univocal way? Can self-gift and sacrifice somehow be in our interest? If so, is this a paradox or a contradiction? Raising such questions involves us in a host of difficulties, of course. It is important that they can only be raised and pursued by exploring the different possible meanings of a rich and complex term like to kalon. Insisting on a single meaning obfuscates questions our experiences of beauty bring about.

Yet even within the limits set by Collins' use of this term, a book that argues that what liberal democratic societies most need is a systematic investigation of the human good ought to raise other fundamental questions. What is this "self" that can be attracted to something that requires self-sacrifice? Are our desires fragmented? Are there "true" and "false" selves somehow? What would this mean for the human good? If the "good" is simply multifarious (Collins says that the various goods that politics needs are at odds with each other and with the highest human good, philosophy), what is the nature of the good, anyway? Is there a universal causal presence of good in the cosmos? If so, and if it is in some way rational, why is reason so alienating to most people, as Collins repeatedly hints that it is? If not, and the cosmos is deeply irrational, then why is a life of reason the highest human good in the first place? What does it say about a common human nature if there is no such thing as a common good? Does it mean we cannot share some deep conception of a good because there is no such thing as human nature, or because the good is not fecund enough to be shared?

A univocal treatment of language allows us to fix the meaning of even the most supple and complex of terms with precision, clarity, and certainty. It implies that language is controllable. However, this strategy lasts only so long as we do not investigate the term in play. In other words, the kind of certainty that is generated by the univocal use of a term relies on a refusal to question an authoritative definition of the term that settles its meaning. Collins gets her definition of the term to kalon from that great thinker, Leo Strauss. Ironically, for a certain kind of Straussian nothing is more unphilosophic than reliance on authority, and nothing is more philosophic than the liberation from convention. Yet the thrill of liberation is not philosophy. Indeed, genuine liberation seems to require much more than the ability to see through a convention using irony. Rather, philosophy consists in the search for wisdom and can only proceed in very small steps over a whole lifetime by patient argument over difficult questions like, "What is the human good?"

Collins begins her book by brilliantly exposing the fact that today's culture requires a vigorous, philosophically informed debate over the meaning of the human good. It is disappointing that a book that begins so hopefully refuses the question she so ably asks.