Aristotle and the Virtues

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Howard J. Curzer, Aristotle and the Virtues, Oxford University Press, 2012, 451pp., $99.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199693726.

Reviewed by Marta Jimenez, Emory University


This is an extensive study of the individual virtues of character in the Nicomachean Ethics (NE), with occasional references to the Eudemian Ethics, Magna Moralia and Rhetoric. The book begins with two detailed sections examining the virtues of character one by one: the first explores the virtues discussed in NE III.6-IV.8; the second is devoted to justice (NE V), friendship (NE VIII-IX), and the relationship between them. The third and final section is a more speculative account of Aristotle's views on moral development, including a theory about the stages of virtue acquisition. The book does not deal with the virtues of thought albeit for a brief discussion of the virtue of phronesis in Chapter 14, in the context of Aristotle's position on the unity of the character virtues.

Since Curzer is mainly interested in offering a modern approach to Aristotelian character virtue, the book is of particular interest to those working on virtue ethics who wish to explore the details of Aristotle's accounts of the virtues of character and the puzzles they raise. For Aristotle scholars, Curzer's focus is refreshing insofar as he deals at length with those central chapters of NE (III.6-V.11) that tend to receive less attention in systematic discussions of virtue. By studying the details of the descriptions of the individual character virtues and attempting to reconstruct through them a general theory of virtue, Curzer reviews old debates and opens new conversations of considerable interest.

Curzer's declared goal is to bring to light a "new Aristotle" by showing that the details of the individual character virtues are central to the ethical theory in NE. His main thesis is that "Aristotle's architectonic" (Curzer's term to describe Aristotle's general virtue theory) in the NE can only be fully articulated by examining the descriptions of the individual virtues (2). Although he does not provide a general account of such an "architectonic," the discussion of each particular virtue reveals its main features throughout the chapters.

Some of the main aspects of this "architectonic" are well known: the doctrine of the mean, the relativity doctrine ("the doctrine that what counts as a right action or passion is relative to the agent's situation" (5)); the virtue-is-the-measure doctrine ("that virtuous people are the standard for what should be done and felt, what is intrinsically valuable, pleasurable, and useful, etc." (63, 71)); and the reciprocity of virtue thesis ("that a person who has one proper virtue has them all" (110)). Other aspects are new and coined by Curzer with the aim of finding common threads among the discussion of the virtues in NE III-V: the doctrine of disjoint spheres ("Each virtue is a disposition to act and feel rightly within completely different sorts of situations" (3, see esp. 20-21, 62, 122)); the parameter doctrine ("each instance of a passion, each token of fear or anger or desire to help others, etc., is a function of several parameters" and "acting and feeling virtuously requires getting all of the relevant parameters right" (42-43, 62, 71)); the right rule doctrine ("the thesis that to each virtue there corresponds a right rule which is a very general, yet not totally useless action-guiding principle" (63)); and the motivation doctrine ("to each virtue Aristotle associates three types of goals. Achieving each sort of goal produces a different sort of pleasure (hēdonē ). Failing to achieve each sort of goal produces a different sort of pain (lupē)" (147-8). And "each virtuous act aims at three sorts of goals: (a) the noble, (b) accomplishing something worthwhile, and/or (c) avoiding something harmful" (203)).

Of Curzer's proposed doctrines, the disjointed spheres is clearly distinct, useful, and well motivated. In contrast, the parameter and the right rule doctrines seem to be mere specifications of aspects of the traditional doctrine of the mean, insofar as "the parameters" are the kinds of particulars in relation to which the agent has to hit the mean in passion and action, while the "right rule" is the general principle according to which the agent ought to determine the mean in each sphere of action. (It is not evident that Aristotle wants to understand the orthos logos in this generalist way, and Curzer would need to supply arguments and textual support to justify this move.) The motivation doctrine is certainly interesting and deserves longer discussion to clarify the relationship between the three types of goals that Curzer associates with each virtue.

Although Curzer claims that he does not list the components of Aristotle's architectonic because he thinks that "in each of Aristotle's accounts of a virtue he deploys some new architectonic component(s)" (165), we often find Curzer (in his own words) "ditching or tweaking a passage or two" (5) to make them fit his vision of Aristotle's framework. Indeed, many chapters start with a number of puzzles about how the virtue at hand does not seem to fully conform with what he takes to be Aristotle's architectonic, and part of the mission that Curzer sets for himself is to harmonize these dissonances.

Curzer also offers under the discussion of each virtue a taxonomy of the "failure modes" (or ways in which the agent can fail to hit the mean), in which he includes not just the two basic vices to which each virtue is opposed, but rather a list of character flaws that include the continent, the incontinent, the vicious and the brutish in each sphere of action. For him these are the basic traits, although upon several occasions he adds many more categories, e.g., the endurant and soft-incontinent. (181). The discussion of all these cases under each virtue helps to articulate a broader view than the one we get from the accounts in NE. The reader should be aware , however, that the charts constructed using these categories are the product of Curzer's own ambitious attempt of systematization and are not directly expressed in Aristotle's own work.

In"Moral Virtues", the book's first and longest (202 pages) section, Curzer discusses in turn the different character virtues, mostly following the order of presentation in NE III and IV.

The second chapter, on courage, is significantly longer than the rest performing a double function: it provides an extensive explanation of how the analysis of a particular virtue reveals Aristotle's general architectonic, and it discusses some specific puzzles peculiar to courage. It is surprising not to find included among what Curzer calls "the failure modes" of courage any of the different ways in which Aristotle explicitly says in NE III.8 that people can seem courageous without being so -- due to shame, fear of punishment, experience, spirit, hope or ignorance. Instead, Curzer imports his list of traits from NE VII.1, and uses his doctrine of parameters to build a scheme where virtuous, continent, incontinent, vicious and brutish are the main categories.

Two of the questions specific to courage Curzer discusses are whether courageous actions are painful for the virtuous person or not (38) and what the relationship between courage and continence is. Curzer aims at "rescuing" Aristotle from the much-discussed problem that his "distinction between virtue and continence seems to collapse in the case of courage" (3). He discusses several modern attempts to solve this problem and proposes his own solution: "Fear does not incline courageous people to shirk courageous acts, but rather it pushes them to guard their safety by being careful about performing courageous acts" (64). By differentiating the function that fear plays in the virtuous person from how it operates in the continent person he is able to maintain courage and continence successfully separated.

The third chapter's title, "Temperance and Incontinence", is misleading in that, although there are scattered references to the discussion of incontinence in NE VII, we find no detailed discussion of incontinence or reference to the numerous debates about Aristotle's account. Curzer does not offer a particularly detailed review of the relevant debates. This is not surprising given that temperance and incontinence are amongst the most studied topics in Aristotle's Ethics and it would be difficult to do justice to the literature in a limited space. Curzer restricts his job to determining the sphere of temperance, the relevant parameters with which temperance is concerned (including "a four-target, twelve-parameter account of temperance" (82)) and the way in which the doctrine of the mean applies specifically to the virtue of temperance. He thus successfully shows that temperance fits in his account of Aristotle's architectonic. However, the chapter is heavily focused on discussing what Aristotle gets wrong and offering friendly amendments and lacks sufficient discussion of the reasons why Aristotle restricts the sphere of temperance as he does.

Chapter 4 proposes a persuasive defense of the unity of liberality against the common view that Aristotle's notion of liberality conflates several different virtues. For Curzer liberality is clearly a single virtue that can be characterized as "the virtue of gift-giving, of economic benevolence," in which the desire for wealth and the desire to help others are intertwined and do not constitute competing motivations. (107)

In the next chapter Curzer argues against the view that liberality and magnificence are separate virtues differing merely by scale. Instead, he defends the claim that magnificence is "heroic liberality" (i.e., "the version of liberality possessed by Aristotle's heroically virtuous person" (109, 116)). Although this imaginative proposal helps to successfully avoid some of the problems generated by separating virtues that share a single sphere, the appeal to the notion of heroic virtue is grounded in thin textual evidence. Moreover, I am not convinced that the thesis that magnificence is "heroic liberality" (as opposed to "large-scale liberality") solves the standard puzzles to which Curzer is attempting to respond. The thesis does produce a certain illusion of neatness, however, by assigning space to the notion of "heroic virtue" of which he will make use in the following chapters. One question that needs to be answered (and that Curzer does not tackle) is why, if Curzer's proposal is right, Aristotle decides to discuss the heroic virtue corresponding to liberality and not the ones corresponding to, e.g., courage or temperance.

In Chapter 6 Curzer takes up the notion of heroic virtue and characterizes megalopsychia as the greatness of those whose virtues are heroic virtues (129); on his proposal, "Aristotle's account of megalopsychia would become a general account of heroic virtue" (6). Since this virtue has given headaches to many interpreters, Curzer's attempt seems promising. However, it comes at the high price of having to admit that megalopsychia "is internally inconsistent" and "conflicts with [Aristotle's] doctrine of the mean and with his treatment of other virtues" (129). In sum, Curzer has to admit that "megalopsychia does not fit into Aristotle's architectonic" as it is inconsistent with the doctrine of the mean (131). Curzer says that "The problem is that Aristotle lists megalopsychia as just another virtue rather than as a high degree of virtue. Megalopsychia appears in the midst of his catalogue of virtues without any indication of its special relationship to the other virtues" (135). This, however, is not completely accurate, since as Curzer himself acknowledges Aristotle considers megalopsychia as "the crown of the virtues" and thus establishes its special status.

Especially interesting is Curzer's take on the "social virtues" of good temper (Chapter 7), wit (Chapter 8), friendliness (Chapter 9) and truthfulness (Chapter 10). He aims to show that these social virtues are not "anachronistic throwbacks to an aristocratic age" (8) but surprisingly modern and pertinent for us.

The second part of the book, "Justice and Friendship", treats separately the virtue of justice, friendship, and the relationship between justice and friendship.

The chapter on justice, "General, Particular, and Poetic Justice (NE V)", explores some of the usual problems raised by Aristotle's account: (a) how to reconcile justice with the doctrine of the mean, (b) how to separate justice from other virtues, and (c) how to include under the virtue of justice the broad range of actions labeled as 'just' by both Aristotle and common use. Curzer offers an original solution to the first problem by introducing the notion of meionexia (which he defines as "desiring . . . less than one's share" (232)) as the opposite vice to pleonexia, so that particular justice can be bracketed by two vices and there is no gap in the Aristotelian system.

To solve the second problem, Curzer describes general justice as "appropriate desire for the goods of fortune" and particular justice as "appropriate desire for what one deserves" (246). These descriptions demarcate well the spheres of the two kinds of justice and thus avoid any overlap with other virtues. However, the result is an excessively self-referential notion of justice (focused on what one deserves) that is unable to explain cases of just actions in which the agent's concern is that others be treated justly. Curzer responds to this objection by introducing nemesis ('righteous indignation') as a third kind of justice, 'poetic justice', which he links to the desire that others be treated justly. (Although Aristotle only mentions nemesis in one line in NE II.7, Curzer provides support from other works of the corpus to make his case.) Thus, if we accept the introduction of nemesis as a complement to the other two kinds of justice, Curzer's strategy succeeds in producing a global account of justice that is "internally consistent and compatible with the core of Aristotle's architectonic" (246), and has the added value of finding a relevant place for nemesis in the system. However, many will find the appeal to nemesis an extreme intervention, and will prefer to find an account of general and particular justice that does not require such a drastic move. One example is Drefcinski's (2011) proposal of interpreting the characteristic desire of particular justice as a wish for what is fair, which includes the desire that others be treated justly. This alternative view, considered in a footnote (246, n.50) but not directly discussed, is more economical and produces similar results.

In Chapter 12, "Varieties of Friendship (NE VIII-IX)", the discussion of friendship is mainly articulated around the distinction between three kinds of friendship in NE VIII-IX and supplemented by some distinctions from Politics IV-VI. By combining these texts, Curzer arrives at a complicated taxonomy of imperfect friendships and comes up with seventy-two kinds of friendship. Of particular interest are the categories of friendship that he obtains by appealing to distinctions from the Politics: the "wholesome" kinds of equal, monarchic or aristocratic friendships; and the deviant kinds of democratic, oligarchic and tyrannical friendship.

The section's final chapter, "Justice in Friendship", argues that justice and friendship are "symbiotic": "Justice is defined in terms of friendship, and good friendship is defined in terms of justice" (8, 286). Curzer argues that "for Aristotle there is no such thing as universal justice or justice simpliciter" (11); instead, there is justice with respect to the different sorts of friendship. This is an original view, which allows Curzer to shed light on some of the puzzles related to the Aristotelian notion of justice.

The book's third part, "Moral Development", is relatively independent from the others, and has no mention of architectonic. Unlike in the first two parts, Curzer does not follow any particular textual order in NE, and instead proposes his own reconstruction of Aristotle's account of moral development by selecting a number of scattered passages from NE that deal with this issue. It is here that Curzer's discussion is most speculative, and justifiably so, since there is no direct discussion of moral development in Aristotle and it is left to the reader to make a reconstruction of the material. As Curzer puts it, "Aristotle actually provides no sustained, explicit account of moral development. Indeed, the chapter that seems closest, NE II.9, is filled with simplistic, self-contradictory advice." (341)

Curzer proposes a pluralist account of moral development in harmony with the clear indications of Aristotle in NE X.9: we become virtuous through nature, habituation and teaching (300). Contrary to the standard interpretation, however, he holds that "Aristotle maintains that habituation and teaching are not simultaneous" (304). By appealing to passages where Aristotle suggests that it is necessary to have a good upbringing to be able to listen to arguments about practical matters, Curzer establishes a division of phases that clashes with the common assumption that habituation and the development of the capacity for reasoning and acquiring concepts about practical situations occur in parallel to one another.

Among the provocative suggestions in this section is the claim that natural virtue is acquired through habituation (307). The problem for this claim is that Aristotle explicitly says of natural virtues that people have them "from the very moment of birth" (NE VI.13, 1144b5-6). So although Curzer has good reasons to suggest otherwise (to support his scheme of the stages of moral development), he needs to clarify that this is an instance of "tweaking" Aristotle's doctrine to make it fit a neater pattern.

In Chapter 15, "Aristotle's Painful Path to Virtue: The Many and the Generous-Minded", Curzer rejects the dominant view, defended most prominently by Burnyeat (1980), that pleasure plays a guiding role in moral development. Curzer offers several convincing objections and follows Broadie (1991) in arguing against Burnyeat that "Before one can derive pleasure from the intrinsic value of virtuous acts, one must first consider them to be intrinsically valuable" (326). As a result, he persuasively concludes that we need to provide an explanation of how learners come to enjoy virtuous actions by appealing to factors other than pleasure.

Although Curzer's criticisms of Burnyeat are correct, he makes the mistake of leaping to an opposite extreme with his thesis that "according to Aristotle, pain rather than pleasure drives moral progress" (13). He offers a plausible account, but unfortunately the view is not free of problems. To follow Broadie (1991) again here, if we use fear of pain (or punishment) as the guiding force in moral development, then the learner "will not end by identifying himself with the action in the way characteristic of virtue" (108). As a result, I submit, the kind of practice under the threat of punishment that Curzer proposes is not a path towards virtue but rather an obstacle to its acquisition.

Chapter 16, "Shame and Moral Development: The Incontinent, the Continent, the Naturally Virtuous, and the Properly Virtuous", furthers the explanation of moral development in terms of punishment, shame (aidōs) and remorse (metameleia). Curzer's claim is that "for Aristotle, moral progress is driven by pain (punishment, aidōs, and remorse) associated with vicious acts rather than pleasure associated with virtuous acts" (364). Although he initially defends -- correctly in my opinion -- that shame works not only as a "negative reinforce[ment]" but also as a "salience projector" (338), I believe he does not sufficiently differentiate between the roles of punishment, shame and remorse.

Explaining how my interpretation of the role of shame differs from Curzer's would require more space than I have here, but I want to point out at least the source of my resistance to taking shame as internalized punishment. Such an account fails to reflect the fact that Aristotle holds shame and fear of punishment in strict contrast with one another precisely because he associates these emotions respectively with those who can make moral progress (i.e., young people with a sense of shame) and those who cannot (i.e., those who merely follow fear of punishment) (NE III.8; X.9). By conflating these two cases and focusing on the painful aspect of shame, Curzer neglects (as do many commentators) the positive connection between shame and the noble that is the relevant source of the positive influence of shame in moral development.

Curzer also develops here what he presents as Aristotle's six stages of moral development:

Aristotle's implicit account of moral development specifies a developmental path in six stages. Each stage consists of a different character type: (a) one of the many, (b) generous-minded youth, (c) incontinent person, (d) continent person, (e) naturally virtuous person, (f) properly virtuous person. (351-352)

This is a tidy picture, and Curzer produces a plausible and interesting story to make it work. However, the story is hardly supported by the textual evidence and the reader should be warned about the speculative character of the proposal.

In Chapter 17, "Aristotle's Losers: The Vicious, the Brutish, Natural Slaves, and Tragic Heroes", Curzer continues with his effort of organizing different "character types" that Aristotle mentions scattered throughout the text of NE. This effort is useful, and it is interesting to explore the relations between the typologies of non-virtuous who are unable to make moral progress.

Finally, in Chapter 18 Curzer describes Aristotle's quest to determine the ultimate goal of moral development: happiness. His account aims at conciliating inclusivist and intellectualist interpretations of eudaimonia by holding the plausible view that the best life aims at contemplation, but it does not neglect practical reason and moral virtue. His final verdict is that Aristotle distinguishes two kinds of people in NE X: "those generally interested in understanding things," who should opt for the supremely happy life of contemplation (which does not interfere with virtuous activity), and "those interested in accomplishing things" who should opt for the secondarily happy life of virtuous activity (425).

Although the book is long, it is easy to navigate thanks to a helpful introduction, a very clear structure and summary conclusions at the end of each chapter. Unfortunately there is no index locorum, but consultation of particular textual issues in the first two parts of the book is facilitated by the fact that each section deals with a corresponding chapter or book in NE (III.6-V, VIII-IX).

Curzer's language is accessible and friendly, and he often tries to make Aristotle's words sound familiar to modern ears. For example, in his discussion of justice he sometimes uses Kantian-sounding notions of duty (e.g., "conflicts of duty", 11, 276, 282-9; "civic duty", 281; "justice-duty", 283-7; "duty of care", 284-5; "duty of rectificatory justice", 286; "duty of reciprocal justice", 286). This has the advantage of making it easier to locate relevant connections between ethical views, but involves the risk of assimilating quite different perspectives.

In summary, Curzer's book contains many interesting discussions about new and classical themes related to Aristotle's treatment of the virtues of character. The project of fully systematizing Aristotle's account of the virtues is ambitious and probably impossible, and many scholars will find Curzer's proposals often both excessively speculative and excessively neat. The result, however, provides a fruitful framework for discussion and presents many provocative ideas that will be challenging and worth considering both for those working on modern virtue ethics and for those with a primary interest in ancient ethics.

Broadie, S. (1991). Ethics with Aristotle. Oxford University Press.

Burnyeat, M. (1980). "Aristotle on Learning to Be Good." In A. O. Rorty (ed.), Essays on Aristotle's Ethics, pp. 69-92. University of California Press.

Drefcinski, S. (2011). "What Kind of Cause Is Music's Influence on Moral Character?" American Catholic Philosophical Quarterly 85(2): 287-296.