Aristotle, De Motu Animalium: a new critical edition of the Greek text

Primavesi Aristotle

Aristotle, De Motu Animalium: a new critical edition of the Greek text by Oliver Primavesi, with an English translation by Ben Morison, and an Introduction by Christof Rapp and Oliver Primavesi, Oxford University Press, 2023, 238pp., $70.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198874461.

Reviewed by Pavel Gregoric, Institute of Philosophy, Zagreb, Croatia


Aristotle’s De motu animalium (MA) is a short treatise, interesting both philosophically and textually. Philosophically, it will be intriguing to most readers because it contains Aristotle’s answer to the question of how the soul moves the body. Very briefly, mental states that represent desired or unwanted things are alterations in the central organ accompanied by microscopic heatings or coolings which are converted into mechanical impulses that spread from the central organ and cause the limbs to move. The hard problem is, of course, to determine what makes alterations in the central organ’s mental states, but that is something Aristotle has already settled in the treatise De anima, or so he believes. In MA he simply assumes that mental states “immediately have their being as alterations of a certain type” (701b17–18, 179) and sets out to explain in some detail how these alterations bring about animal locomotion, under what conditions, and by what means. The key role in this story is assigned to the “connate pneuma”, which seems to be a special blend of warm air trapped inside the central organ from conception, functioning as a converter of thermal alterations into mechanical impulses. So, nothing mysterious or supernatural there, and hence no grounds for comparison with the Cartesian pineal gland.

Leaving aside the antiquated anatomical and physiological points of detail, in MA readers will see a masterly philosophical mind at work, seeking to establish very general truths. Essentially, Aristotle takes the view that self-motion presupposes rest. To be more precise, he argues that every episode of self-motion from one place to another requires no less than four unmoved items: (i) an object of desire, which causes motion without itself being in motion, i.e., as an external unmoved mover, (ii) an external point of rest against which the animal propels itself, (iii) internal points of rest, i.e., fixed parts of joints against which the bones of the limbs are pushed or pulled, and, crucially, (iv) the soul, which enables the animal to perceive and imagine things: when the animal perceives or imagines things that it finds pleasant, honorable, advantageous or otherwise desirable, a series of physical events are triggered in the body that result in the movement of body parts that produce motion of the animal as a whole. Unlike the first three items, which are extended physical things that can be, and often are themselves moved, the fourth item is a form, an unextended principle that cannot itself be subject to motion. So, the external unmoved mover (object of perception and desire), which is only qualifiedly unmoved, crucially depends on the internal unmoved mover (soul), which is unqualifiedly unmoved.

In addition, MA affords a good glimpse of Aristotle’s philosophical methodology. He tests his theory against possible counterexamples, he uses geometrical models and vivid analogies to support his arguments, and he quotes Homer to clinch his point. Moreover, the treatise contains valuable discussions of phantasia, the practical syllogism, and the emotions, and it presents a crisp formulation of Aristotle’s cardiocentrism that may be difficult, at first sight, to square with his hylomorphism developed in De anima. These and several other philosophical issues are masterfully surveyed in the first introduction to this volume, written by Christof Rapp (1–66). In this piece the reader will also find an overview of the structure, purpose, authenticity, and chronology of MA. Along the way, Rapp provides judicious appraisal of the current scholarly debates sparked by Aristotle’s treatise, so the reader will gain not only an understanding of Aristotle’s treatise, but also of its place in recent debates.

Textually, MA is exciting because of Oliver Primavesi’s recent discovery of a new hyparchetype, now called beta, which enabled him to constitute a more reliable edition of the Greek text than any other available to date. Very briefly, Primavesi has established that the forty-seven surviving manuscripts which transmit the text of MA go back to two late-antique ancestors, alpha and beta, which can be reconstructed from their respective descendants. This means that serious errors in the text of the alpha-branch, on which all modern printed editions of MA (August Immanuel Bekker, Werner Jaeger, Luigi Torraca, Pierre Louis, Martha Nussbaum) rely, can now be corrected by drawing on the text of the beta-branch. In the second introduction to this volume (67–156), Primavesi tells a detailed story of his discovery in a way which sometimes resembles a detective tale. Although some readers might think that this introduction should have been shorter and more to the point, just stating the results and editorial policies, those who persist will be rewarded by an appreciation of the philological expertise and labor that goes into the production of sound critical editions of ancient texts.

Primavesi’s introduction contains a stemma (133) and four appendices. The first appendix lists all forty-seven known Greek manuscripts of MA, whereas the second lists the principal manuscripts of the Latin translation of William of Moerbeke, which Moerbeke subsequently revised in light of a second Greek manuscript of MA that is closely related to the manuscripts that belong to the beta-branch. The third appendix lists all 120 places in which Primavesi’s edition diverges from Nussbaum’s. Dozens of these divergences are philosophically relevant. The fourth and longest appendix (146–156) will perhaps be the hardest one for most readers to appreciate, as it defends Primavesi’s conclusions about the crucial manuscript for the beta-branch, Berolinensis Phillippicus 1507, against a position assigned to it in a 1990 doctoral dissertation that examines the manuscript tradition of another Aristotelian treatise.

The two introductions are followed by a critical edition of the Greek text with a running translation (162–189). The Greek text is accompanied by two apparatuses at the bottom of the page. The first lists passages from other works of Aristotle as well as other ancient authors to which the text of MA refers, or which are otherwise immediately relevant for that part of the text. The second is a critical apparatus which is helpfully limited to cases where the printed text differs from the reconstructed archetype or where the two main branches differ from each other. In an appendix to the edition, however, there is also an extended apparatus (190–202) which sets out the manuscript evidence for the readings mentioned in the second apparatus and lists notable variant readings.

The edition of the Greek text is clearly superior to all other available editions, but scholars used to Oxford Classical Texts and Loeb editions (as opposed to Budé or Mainer editions) will probably find the policy of inserting Bekker references straight into the text, often dividing individual words, disruptive. The present reviewer will abuse his position to express his sincere hope that OUP will stick to its usual and unobtrusive way of printing Bekker references on outer margins of Greek texts, avoiding abominations such as “πλάτ|26|τουσιν” (164), “οὐ|700b1|δαμῶς” (172) or “ἐγρήγορ|9|σιν” (186). The policy of printing the iota adscriptum, instead of subscriptum, may also require some adjustment on the reader’s part. The only justification offered for this policy—which does not strike me as particularly strong—is adherence to the style of the oldest manuscript of Aristotle’s text that we’ve got, namely the famous Parisinus graecus 1853 from the 10th century (134).

Benjamin Morison’s English translation is reliable and as readable as the original Greek allows it to be. “In order to facilitate comparison,” the editors write, “we have inserted references at the beginning of each English sentence which indicate the Bekker-line in which the beginning of the corresponding Greek sentence is to be found” (135). So, the reader is asked to look for the Bekker-line number in the Greek text and then skim to the right for a pause or period, after which the corresponding text will follow. Again, printing Bekker-lines on the outer margins is a more elegant way of facilitating comparison, although it may not always be as precise.

The reader should be aware that the book under review is a companion to the hefty Symposium Aristotelicum (SA) volume on Aristotle’s De motu animalium, prepared by the same editors and published by the same press in 2020. Essentially, the present book is the SA volume minus the interpretative chapter-by-chapter essays by distinguished scholars, which amount to the largest extant commentary on this Aristotelian text. The differences in the overlapping material are very minor. Apart from a few corrected typos, references to the essays in the SA volume are reformatted in the introductions and a few new references are added to the pre-existent footnotes; additionally, Primavesi has slightly reformulated the opening sentence of his introduction so as to avoid the implication that all treatises of the Parva naturalia deal with “activities common to body and soul”, and sharpened the penultimate paragraph of the fourth appendix to his introduction. The Greek text differs insignificantly at two places—μάλα instead of πάνυ at 700a1, and an inserted τοῦ before ἐσχάτου at 702b8—with the list of divergences from Nussbaum’s edition revised accordingly.

The bibliography (203–221) is purged of the numerous entries referred to in the essays contained in the SA volume, and it is expanded by 26 new entries. Most of these new entries refer to works mentioned in the extended apparatus but inexplicably missing in the bibliography to the SA volume. Five of the added bibliographic entries are reviews of the SA volume that have appeared in scholarly journals since its publication, and the rest are entries corresponding to a few references discretely added to the pre-existent footnotes to the two introductions. These few entries are relevant publications that could not be included in the SA volume because they appeared after, or not long before, the publication of the SA volume. Perhaps the revised bibliography should have included two major publications from 2021 which are directly relevant to Aristotle’s MA: the CUP volume Aristotle on How Animals Move, edited by Andrea Falcon and Stasinos Stavrianeas, with Pantelis Golitsis’s new critical edition of De incessu animalium, and David Charles’s OUP monograph The Undivided Self: Aristotle and the ‘Mind-Body’ Problem.

To conclude, specialists in Aristotle who own the SA volume will not be tempted to acquire this book, except perhaps for the bibliography which includes entries missing in the bibliography to the SA volume. However, students and scholars who come to Aristotle’s De motu animalium for the first time will appreciate this more compact and slightly cheaper volume. With two authoritative introductions to this fascinating little treatise, one on philosophical and the other on textual matters, with the best critical edition of the Greek text to date and an excellent facing translation, it is a timely replacement for Nussbaum’s 1978 volume. Its service is expected to last at least until the appearance of Primavesi’s firmly announced editio maior of Aristotle’s De motu animalium (see 70 n26, p. 90 n167 and 129 n262).