Aristotle, Eudemian Ethics

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Aristotle, Eudemian Ethics, Brad Inwood and Raphael Woolf (eds.), Cambridge University Press, 2013, 168pp., $19.99 (pbk), ISBN 9780521121422.

Reviewed by Hendrik Lorenz, Princeton University


Having been neglected for many centuries, Aristotle's other, less famous, treatise on ethics, the Eudemian Ethics, has received a good deal of attention in the last few decades. In fact, scholarly interest in the work has recently been further increasing, and it is an indication of this that the last three years have brought us three new translations of the Eudemian Ethics, two in English and one in French,[1] and, in the former two, the first modern translations of the work in eight books, as apparently a complete treatise.

The Eudemian Ethics discusses a range of topics rather similar to that of the Nicomachean Ethics, and it proceeds in a rather similar order: beginning with a discussion of happiness as the highest humanly achievable good, and a conception of it as active exercise of virtue, Aristotle then offers theories of character-virtues like courage and generosity on the one hand and of intellectual virtues such as theoretical and practical wisdom on the other. He rounds out his conception of the well-lived human life by providing philosophical analyses of self-control and its lack, of pleasure, and of friendship. The work ends with some loosely unified discussions, in Book 8, that mostly focus on the interrelations among the virtues that feature in much of the body of the work.

There are many places in the Eudemian Ethics in which Aristotle says things not said in the Nicomachean Ethics, and in some places of the former work he makes claims that seem to be in conflict with ideas presented in the latter work. Most scholars think that he wrote the Nicomachean Ethics after the Eudemian Ethics, and that the later treatise was meant to supersede the earlier one. If this is right, then having both treatises gives us the opportunity to study Aristotle's work in ethics at two distinct stages of his life. On topics on which the two treatises are in agreement, we might be able to illuminate the one by interpreting it in light of things said in the other. On topics where they conflict, we might learn philosophical lessons by reflecting on reasons for and against each of the conflicting positions. Anyone interested in Aristotle's ethics thus has good reason to study the Eudemian Ethics.

Translators of the Eudemian Ethics face an unusually difficult task, given that we do not have a truly satisfactory Greek edition of the treatise for them to translate from. Susemihl's Teubner edition (1884) neglected an important medieval manuscript. The Oxford Classical Text of the work, edited by R. R. Walzer and J. M. Mingay in 1991, corrects this shortcoming, but introduces far too many unwarranted "emendations," conjectural attempts to restore what Aristotle originally wrote by changing the text transmitted by the medieval manuscripts that are our oldest and most authoritative witnesses. As a result of this unfortunate situation, Inwood and Woolf depart from the text of the OCT edition of the Eudemian Ethics on almost every page, sometimes multiple times, and usually with excellent reason.

A complication that has not yet been mentioned is that the medieval manuscripts that transmit Aristotle's treatises to us present three central books of the Eudemian Ethics, covering the character-virtue of justice, the intellectual virtues, self-control and its lack, and pleasure, as also belonging to the Nicomachean Ethics. Books 4-6 of the Eudemian Ethics have also come down to us as Books 5-7 of the Nicomachean Ethics. These are the so-called common books. On stylistic grounds many scholars think that the common books were originally written to form part of the Eudemian Ethics, and so the recent trend to include them in translations of that work has something to be said for it.

However, it is entirely possible, and in fact probable, that Aristotle himself revised and updated his discussions of such important topics as the nature of justice, the intellectual virtues, and lack of self-control for, and perhaps also after, inclusion in the Nicomachean Ethics. Furthermore, there are fairly strong historical reasons for thinking that these three books were included in a ten-book edition of the Nicomachean Ethics, long before someone decided to fill the large and rather conspicuous gap in the middle of an earlier five-book edition of the Eudemian Ethics by inserting the correspondingNicomachean books, thus creating the appearance of a complete version of the Eudemian Ethics and at the same time presenting those three books as common to the two treatises.[2] In their introduction, Inwood and Woolf acknowledge the possibility that "the common books may have been somewhat revised for reuse in the Nicomachean Ethics" (p. ix). But as readers move on from Book 3 to Book 4, nothing alerts them to the very real possibility that the proper home of what are presented as Books 4-6 of the treatise is in fact the Nicomachean Ethics. A direct and explicit indication to this effect would have been in order.

The translation itself is very good. It closely and reliably tracks Aristotle's train of thought and is at the same time as readable as one could wish. Inwood and Woolf's conservative approach to Aristotle's text is commendable. They frequently restore readings transmitted by medieval manuscripts, against conjectures favored in Walzer and Mingay's OCT, and vindicate the manuscript readings by showing them to be perfectly intelligible. (In a few places, they miss opportunities to rehabilitate good readings of authoritative manuscripts that were disfavored by Walzer and Mingay, such as at 1223a2 and at 1226b18-19.) In terms of readability and good judgment shown in textual questions, Inwood and Woolf are more or less on a par with Kenny's recent translation, which is also very good. With regard to precision in rendering the details of Aristotle's argumentation, they have a slight edge over Kenny.

Apart from their failure to signal the problematic status of the so-called common books with sufficient clarity and emphasis, Inwood and Woolf merit criticism for a number of unsatisfactory translations of key terms or expressions, and for lack of conceptual cohesion that arises from failure to translate recurring expressions consistently.

The most egregious example of a key term translated badly is sophia, which Inwood and Woolf translate as "expertise." To begin with, this translation severs the connection between philosophy and the love of wisdom. Whatever may be the case in philosophy departments in, say, Toronto or London in 2013, philosophy in Athens in the fourth century BCE was conceived by its practitioners as love of wisdom, not love of expertise! Sophia was an honorific term that was contested in Plato's and Aristotle's time. Whatever precisely it consisted in, it was the most valuable kind of intellectual accomplishment. Isocrates, a prominent intellectual of Plato's and Aristotle's time, held that sophia was a decidedly practical form of knowledge, having to do with what is advantageous to humans (Antidosis 270-85). Aristotle disagreed, arguing that since there are more divine beings than humans, sophia could not be knowledge of merely human things, but has to concern those things that are by nature most valuable (NE 6.7 = EE 5.7, 1141a28-b3). He clearly is assuming that whatever sophia turns out to be, it is the most valuable form of knowledge, and that the most valuable form of knowledge concerns the most valuable things. But given that "wisdom" denotes a supremely valuable kind of intellectual accomplishment, whatever precisely it may consist in, it seems well suited as a translation of sophia, and certainly far preferable to "expertise." One might then translate phronēsis (translated in Inwood and Woolf as "wisdom") as "practical wisdom" and technē as "expertise."

In some passages, Inwood and Woolf's choice to translate sophia as "expertise" (and phronēsis as "wisdom) seriously impedes comprehension. For example, at 1143b33-35 (in EE 5.12 = NE 6.12) Aristotle says that it would seem strange if phronēsis, being inferior to sophia, were authoritative over it. Why would anyone think that wisdom is inferior to expertise? At 1142a16-18 (EE 5.8 = NE6.8) Aristotle means to explain the apparent fact that a young person can be a mathematician, but cannot be a sophos (a person of sophia)or a natural philosopher. It is, he says, because the objects of mathematics are abstractions, whereas the principles of both sophia and natural philosophy derive from experience. However, it is nonsense to claim that a young person can be a mathematician, but cannot be an expert, as being a mathematician is of course a way of being an expert. What Aristotle means by sophia here is not expertise, or theoretical expertise, but wisdom, the goal of philosophy itself.

Another key term that is poorly translated is ergon. The Eudemian Ethics features its own ergon argument, a counterpart to the better-known argument in Nicomachean Ethics 1.7. Inwood and Woolf, perhaps not surprisingly, translate the central term as "function." However, one thing that Aristotle makes clear in the Eudemian version of the argument is that at least here he uses the wordergon in two ways: in one use it refers to products that are distinct from use or activity, as the ergon of a builder is a house; in the other use, something's ergon just is its use or activity, as the ergon of sight is seeing (EE 2.1, 1219a13-17). Aristotle makes clear that the concept of ergon is unified, even though it admits of these two distinct uses. It is unified because the ergon of each thing is its end (1219a8): what is best and ultimate, such that all other (relevant) things are for its sake (1219a19-11). Seeing is the ergon of sight because it is the best thing that sight accomplishes and is what sight ultimately is for. Likewise, a house is the ergon of a builder because it is what a builder as such is ultimately for. (Note the implication that building is not the ergon of a builder!) Given the uses to which Aristotle puts the word, it is clearly better translated (with Kenny) as "work" than as "function." The latter translation fares well in cases in which the ergon in question is an activity, but is at best awkward in cases in which the ergon is, say, a house or a shoe. By contrast, "work" (which, by the way, is cognate with ergon) does well in both kinds of case.

Furthermore, in a number of places Inwood and Woolf fail to translate recurring expressions uniformly, making it hard for the reader to see conceptual links that are plain in Aristotle's Greek. An example: Aristotle, in his fullest Eudemian statement of what character-virtue is, describes it as a hexis prohairetikē (EE 2.10, 1227b5-10; cf. NE 2.6, 1106b36-1107a2); the same expression recurs inEE 5.2 (= NE 6.2, 1139a22-26), where the idea is that since character-virtue is a state that is exercised in excellent decision-making, its exercise combines correct use of reason and correct desire. In translating EE 2.10, Inwood and Woolf render the expression hexis prohairetikē as "a state that makes decisions," which seems reasonable in light of the claim made in the next chapter that character-virtue makes decision unerring by making its possessor decide on the correct goals for action (1227b 36-8, cf. 12-15). But in EE 5.2, they translate the same expression as "a state involving decision." This obscures the link between this passage and the antecedent explication of the nature of character-virtue. It also leaves the reader in the dark about the precise way in which Aristotle takes character-virtue to "involve" decision, thus making it hard to see how character-virtue is meant to relate to correct use of practical reason and correct desire.

Another example of non-uniform translation is more troubling, since it conceals what seems to be a contradiction between EE 2.1 and EE 5.13 (= NE 6.13). In the former chapter, Aristotle assigns the intellectual virtues (e.g., wisdom) to reason itself, on the grounds that they are "accompanied by reason" (as Inwood and Woolf translate Aristotle's claim that they are meta logou, "with reason,"1220a8-9). By contrast, Aristotle says, the character-virtues belong to a part of the soul that is non-rational, but naturally capable of following reason (1220a10-11). By implication, the character-virtues, as conceived here, are not "accompanied by reason," whatever precisely this may mean. In EE 5.13 (1144b28-30), Aristotle distinguishes his conception of character-virtue from Socrates' by saying that whereas the latter thought the character-virtues just are forms of reason (logoi), Aristotle himself takes them to be states that are meta logou ("with reason"). Inwood and Woolf have Aristotle state his own view by saying that the character-virtues "are accompanied by reasoning." The slightly different formulations in the two passages suggest that Aristotle may have in mind some subtle distinction: perhaps the character-virtues fail to be "accompanied by reason" (EE 2.1), but are nevertheless "accompanied by reasoning" (EE 5.13)? Might his idea be that although the character-virtues are themselves non-rational states, their exercise is always accompanied by correct practical reasoning? This suggestion is, of course, an artifact of translating the same expression differently in these two passages. It would have been better, and easy enough, to render them uniformly.

A few relatively minor shortcomings aside, Inwood and Woolf have given us an extremely valuable translation of an important, but neglected text. Students of the Eudemian Ethics will no doubt use it and learn from it for many years to come. It is to be hoped, and expected, that along with Kenny's recent translation, it will attract readers to the Eudemian Ethics who may not otherwise have gained access to it. Those who wish to study the treatise in only one English translation should choose this one.

[1] Anthony Kenny, Aristotle: The Eudemian Ethics, Oxford, 2011; Catherine Dalimier, Aristote: Ethique à EudémeParis, 2013; and now Inwood and Woolf. After completing the present review I became aware of yet another recent translation: Peter L. P. Simpson, The Eudemian Ethics of Aristotle, New Brunswick, 2013. This, too, is in eight books.

[2] The reasons are presented with clarity and force in O. Primavesi, “Ein Blick in den Stollen von Skepsis: Vier Kapitel zur frühen Überlieferung des Corpus Aristotelicum,” Philologus 151.1 (2007), 51-77.