Aristotle: His Life and School

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Carlo Natali, Aristotle: His Life and School, D. S. Hutchinson (ed.), Princeton University Press, 2013, 219pp., $29.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780691096537.

Reviewed by Michael J. Griffin, University of British Columbia


D. S. Hutchinson has delivered a meticulously edited and revised English translation of Carlo Natali's standard-setting philosophical biography of Aristotle.[1] The result is an outstanding, accessible book that manages to improve on its predecessor, blending narrative concision with a comprehensive appraisal of the sources and shifting gracefully between storytelling, detective work, and institutional history. Aristotle: His Life and School has no real competition in English: interested non-specialists will benefit from Natali's crisp and compendious survey of the scrappy evidence for Aristotle's life (summarized in a new Index of Sources, pp. 181-95), and may be surprised to uncover the uneven foundations of the speculative edifices constructed by Werner Jaeger[2] and his predecessors; at the same time, even experts will find some new gristle to chew.

Intact here are Natali's most important and original findings of 1991: Aristotle's biography culminates in the discovery, defense, and institutionalization of a new way of life, the bios theoretikosor intellectual life, understood not as a vocation ("a Beruf in the Weberian sense," p. 70) nor as a contribution to the socialization and education of the young (paideia) (p. 85, against J. P. Lynch),[3] but as a personal choice, "a way of giving meaning" to an aristocratic Greek's life by expending scholÄ“ (freedom, leisure) on philosophy (p. 66);[4] the Peripatetic school down to Lyco, then, was a foundation facilitating the pursuit of this way of life on the part of a small community (p. 95). Natali's helpful treatment of Aristotle's methods of teaching, the importance of books in the Peripatos (ch. 3) and the course of Aristotelian studies since Zeller (ch. 4) are also substantially unchanged, though improved in details, and augmented by a new postscript taking account of developments in scholarship since 1991.

But philosophers already familiar with Natali's earlier work should also be aware that this is much more than a simple translation. When an earlier draft of the text entered the hands of Hutchinson, who had provided the original impetus for the English translation in the late 1990s, a painstaking scholarly project began: the ancient sources were retranslated from scratch, using new critical editions where available; the results were then collated by Hutchinson and Natali in correspondence, in an independent "repetition of Natali's original philological procedures" (xi); a new index of sources was developed along the way, along with a postscript surveying the past two decades of relevant scholarship; and a number of notes were augmented or updated (xv), usually improving the clarity of the Italian version or building on important new findings, such as Philip Harding's 2006 edition of the fragments of Didymus On Demosthenes. This is really an updated and improved edition of the 1991 book in a new language, with the full collaboration of the author and a weighty dose of enhancement and refinement by an editor who is respected as a scholar in his own right.[5]

Following an explanatory Preface in which Hutchinson explains the inception and history of the translation (vii-xix) and Natali's short Introduction, the book is divided into four main sections: (1) "The Biography of Aristotle" (pp. 5-71), (2) "Institutional Aspects of the School of Aristotle" (pp. 72-95), (3) "Internal Organization of the School of Aristotle" (pp. 96-119), (4) "Studies of Aristotle's Biography from Zeller to the Present Day" (pp. 120-44).

The first, biographical chapter is marked by Natali's sober handling of the ancient sources for Aristotle's life, which (as Ingemar Düring's pioneering 1957 study emphasized)[6] arise from tremendously diverse motivations -- ranging from contemporaries who fiercely attacked or defended their subject to late ancient, Neoplatonist hagiographies of dios AristotelÄ“s ("divine Aristotle"). We begin with Aristotle's relationship to his hometown, Stagira (p. 6), and a balanced treatment of the hostile testimony of Demochares (p. 7). Natali describes the evidence for Aristotle's relationships to his father Nicomachus and mother Phaestis (p. 8, which incidentally offers a nice example of Hutchinson's visual device of demarcating original sources in boldface print), and follows the young philosopher-to-be through his years as a "provincial pupil" of the Academy (p. 17), to his time with the tyrant Hermias of Atarneus, where he likely met his future wife (p. 31), to his celebrated term as tutor to Alexander the Great (p. 42) (though the evidence for the nature of their relationship and the content of Aristotle's lessons is shown to be sadly scrappy), down to his return to Athens, where he may or may not have won some renown (p. 55), his trial and flight (p. 60), and his witness to the philosophical way of life, the biostheoretikos (pp. 64-71). There are still traces here of Wilamowitz's influential division of Aristotle's biography into his youth (Lehrjahre), travels (Wanderjahre), and teaching (Meisterjahre),[7]but the gaps are meticulously penned or pencilled in as the evidence permits, and we are left with the fresh impression of a coherent life partially glimpsed from many points of view.

Natali represents the main scholarly debates clearly and neutrally, and usually takes a clear stand. For example, whatever Aristotle and Plato's intellectual disagreements might have been, passages like Nic. Eth. 1.4 (1096a11-13) and Pol. 2.6 (1265a10-12) strongly suggest that their relationship remained cordial (p. 21); the evidence that Aristotle conducted a substantial part of his biological research at Assos and Mytilene cannot be ruled out (p. 42); Aristotle certainly taught Alexander at a young age, but it is almost impossible to determine what he taught him (as some have tried to do from Aristotle's own works), and certainly there is little evidence for Aristotle's engagement in politics on behalf of Macedonian interests. Natali's Aristotle, unlike (say)Wilamowitz's, is not driven by political concerns, but by the choice of "the theoretical life, philosophical research, and philosophical reflection" (p. 50). The argumentative core of this chapter is §10 ("From Traditional Customs, a New Model", pp. 64-71), in which Natali argues compellingly for his account of the Peripatos as an institutional expression of Aristotle's quest for the bios theoretikos.

The second chapter examines the "institutional aspects" of Aristotle's "school," including the nature of the philosophical schools in general (were they thiasoi, or legal foundations? Natalithinks they were, p. 83, but not for training the young, p. 85). Although Aristotle himself (as a resident alien) could not have held property in Athens, some of his successors may have owned real estate that served as a foundation for the practice of the philosophical life (p. 87; considerable weight is placed on Theophrastus' will, describing a place for sumphilosophein or 'philosophizing together', for which see Aristotle, Nic. Eth. 9.12, 1172a1-8), and this basic function continued through the early institutional history of the Peripatos (p. 95).

In the third chapter, Natali explores the "internal organization" of the school, discussing various methodological subjects like the function and impact of books (p. 98) -- including thecolourful anecdote that depicts Aristotle in the Academy as a reader among talkers (pp. 96, 20) -- as well as means of information-gathering and research (p. 104) and methods of teaching in the Peripatos, including the use of diagrams (p. 113). Natali's discussion of ancient reports about the preservation of Aristotle's "library" is also clear and useful (pp. 101-104).

The fourth and final chapter surveys the ancient sources for Aristotle's biography, and delivers a brisk but fair survey of modern studies of the subject since Zeller.[8] Natali describes the later nineteenth-century tendency to interpret Aristotle's life in a political light. Next comes the fresh perspective of Jaeger's groundbreaking Aristoteles (1923), which sketched Aristotle's intellectual development as an evolution away from Academic Platonism, highlighted Aristotle's philosophical and spiritual motives over speculation about his role in any political machinations (a move which Natali by and large endorses), and painted him as a classic thinker who "succeeded in overcoming the archaic spiritual unity of Plato and of previous philosophers without going so far as the positivism of modern science," and who established the ancestor of the modern university (p. 139). Natali also discusses Philip Merlan's efforts to show that Aristotle's opposition to Plato and the Academy had been overstated,[9] before describing the fundamental step forward taken by Düring, who worked out the biases of individual ancient sources and attempted to set them in their context (pp. 141-42).

The Postscript, written in 2012, briefly sketches the two decades of scholarship that have intervened between Natali's 1991 publication and this one. This comprises a helpful but brief survey of key works on the biography of Aristotle and the Aristotelian tradition since the early 1990s, mostly descriptive rather than critical. The (new) Index of Sources, Bibliographical Index, and Index of Persons and Places (181-219), are all very welcome, carefully prepared, and easy to use.

It should perhaps be stressed that this is not, by and large, a book about Aristotle's philosophy: a reader will not find here the kind of reconstruction and critical analysis of an Aristotelian position that she might locate in, say, Terence Irwin's Aristotle's First Principles (Oxford 1988). This volume, like Natali1991, is about Aristotle as a person and philosopher, the institutions and methods that he helped to define for posterity, and his views about (roughly speaking) metaphilosophy, what philosophical practice is and ought to be. That intent is nicely captured by the original title Bios theoretikos.

It is difficult to complain about this volume: as the saying goes, it does exactly what it says on the label. Moreover, unlike some translations of academic works originating in another language, Hutchinson's English is usually flowing and idiomatic, and a pleasure to read. The scholarship is extremely careful and accurate. The volume is well produced, easy to use, and carefully proofread; I found barely a handful of typographical slips in the body text (pp. 62, 69, 84, 140), none important to the sense. Hutchinson's device of using boldface print to set off ancient sources at a glance (a technique also adopted in Hutchinson and Johnson's ongoing reconstruction and translation of Aristotle's Protrepticus)[10] is usually helpful, though perhaps a little jarring on occasions when the material in boldface is not especially important or conceptually prominent (e.g., p. 130): on the whole, I found it to be a net benefit.

Natali and Hutchinson are to be commended for an outstanding achievement. This should become the standard work in English on Aristotle's life and school.

[1] Bios Theoretikos: la vita di Aristotele e l'organizzazione della sua scuola, Bologna 1991.

[2] W. Jaeger, Aristoteles: Grundlegung einer Geschichte seiner Entwicklung, Berlin 1923, translated in English as Aristotle: Fundamentals of the History of His Development, tr. R. Robinson, Oxford 1934, 2nd ed. Oxford 1948, repr. 1962.

[3] J. P. Lynch, Aristotle's School: A Study of a Greek Educational Institution, Berkeley 1972-79.

[4] For this interpretation of Aristotle's "way of life," see also J. Cooper, Pursuits of Wisdom: Six Ways of Life in Ancient Philosophy from Socrates to Plotinus, Princeton 2012, ch. 3.

[5] Among many notable achievements, Hutchinson is co-editor with John Cooper of the standard modern English Plato, Plato: Complete Works (Indianapolis 1997).

[6] I. Düring, Aristotle in the Ancient Biographical Tradition, Göteborg 1957.

[7] U. von Wilamowitz-Moellendorff, Aristoteles und Athen, 1893, 2nd ed. Berlin 1966, 1: 308-72, discussed by Natali on pp. 136-37.

[8] E. Zeller, Die Philosophie der Griechen in ihrer geschichtlichen Entwicklung, Leipzig 1879, 4th ed. 1921, repr. Hildesheim 1963.

[9] In 1946, 1954, and 1959, collected in P. Merlan, Kleine philologische Schriften, ed. F. Merlan, Hildesheim and New York 1976, 127-43, 144-52, and 167-88.