Aristotle on Desire

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Giles Pearson, Aristotle on Desire, Cambridge University Press, 2012, 276pp., $99.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781107023918.

Reviewed by Krisanna M. Scheiter, Union College


Aristotle does not provide a detailed account of desire in any of his surviving works, even though he discusses desire in his psychological, biological, and ethical treatises. Perhaps the fact that there is no systematic account of desire in any of his existing works explains why few commentators focus on the nature of desire itself, and instead direct their attention to the role it plays in other aspects of Aristotle's philosophy. Pearson's book fills a void, focusing on the object of desire. Since the relevant passages are scattered throughout the Aristotelian corpus Pearson must do quite a bit of detective work, drawing from a wide range of texts. The result is a thorough and compelling account of desire in Aristotle.

The book is divided into three parts. Part I focuses on the object of orexis ("orexis" being Aristotle's word for desire in general). Part II examines the three kinds of orexis Aristotle discusses in his various works, namely, epithumiathumos, and boulêsis. The first two parts are aimed primarily at specialists in ancient philosophy, but Part III will be of interest to contemporary philosophers as well. Here Pearson puts Aristotle into dialogue with philosophers, such as Thomas Nagel, Thomas Scanlon, and G.F. Schuler, arguing quite convincingly that Aristotle has something to contribute to contemporary discussions concerning the philosophy of desire. Finally, Pearson ends the book with a rewarding chapter on virtue and non-rational desire in Aristotle's moral psychology. Overall, I find Pearson's arguments persuasive, especially concerning the object of orexis. There are, however, some issues that can be raised against his interpretation of specific desires, particularly thumos.

In Part I Pearson begins his analysis by looking at the scope and aim of orexis. He takes as his starting point Aristotle's claim that we are moved to action only when we grasp the object of desire (37, 39; De Anima 3.10, 433b11-12). Pearson wants to know what it is that we are grasping when we grasp the object of desire. Whatever it is must move us to action, and so the object of desire cannot be merely the activity or particular state of affairs we desire (34). Thinking about taking a walk, for example, will not move us to actually take a walk. We must also think that taking a walk will be good or pleasant (35). Pearson notes that when we consider specific examples of desire in Aristotle, we see that all desire is evaluative in nature (34). But even this will not move us to action, since we can think about how good or pleasant it would be to take a walk, without being moved to do so (37-38). Pearson argues that we must grasp the prospect of doing the thing we have deemed good or pleasant in order to be moved to action (39). We must envisage the pleasure or benefits we will receive when we take our walk. What this means for Pearson is that all desire requires phantasia (often translated somewhat misleadingly as "imagination"), which is a controversial claim (57). There are passages in De Anima that suggest perception alone is enough for desire (at least enough for epithumia) (DA 2.3, 414a32-414b6; 3.3, 428a10-11; 3.10, 433b28-29). Pearson explains away the conflicting passages quite convincingly, overcoming any doubts they may raise. We must have some way of being 'in touch' with the prospect of the object of desire, and we cannot do this through perception alone, since perception is tied to the present (51-60). Thus, phantasia is absolutely necessary for desire.

In chapter 3 Pearson goes on to investigate the object of desire. In DA 3.10 Aristotle claims that orexis is for the "real or the apparent good" (433a27-28). The key to understandingorexis is determining what Aristotle means by the "good." Pearson points out two very useful constraints that can help us figure out what Aristotle has in mind. First, animals, as well as humans, must be able to grasp the "good," since both are capable of orexis, according to Aristotle. Thus, grasping the good cannot require belief or reason, since animals are not capable of either (62). Second, the good of orexis must be different from the good of boulêsis, which Aristotle also says aims at the "good" (see, for example, Nicomachean Ethics3.4, 1113a23-24, 5.9, 1136b7-8). Boulêsis is a species of orexis and so they cannot share the exact same object (62). With these two constraints in mind, Pearson argues that the "good" should be understood broadly to include the desire for pleasure (epithumia) and the desire for retaliation (thumos), as well as the desire for what we rationally grasp as good (68-74; see also chapter 7). Distinguishing between a broad and narrow conception of the good explains how animals can desire something as good, since what is pleasant is also what is good broadly speaking, and differentiates the object of orexis from the object of boulêsis.

In Part II Pearson moves on to the species of desire. He begins with epithumia; our desire for what is pleasant. He claims that Aristotle uses epithumia in two ways, narrowly and broadly. He uses epithumia narrowly to refer to bodily pleasures, such as those obtained through food, drink, and sex (92-100). The narrow use of epithumia is not very controversial, but Pearson claims, correctly I think, that Aristotle also uses epithumia broadly to include non-bodily desires like the pleasure one takes in learning (100-104). In chapter 5 Pearson moves on to thumos, rejecting the more popular claim that thumos is a desire for the kalon (which means the "fine" or "noble") (131-138).[1] He argues instead that thumos is synonymous with orgê, which Aristotle defines as a desire for retaliation (timôria) (Rhetoric 2.2, 1378a31-33). The final species of desire Pearson looks at is boulêsis, which is a desire for the good. Many commentators claim that boulêsis aims at eudaimonia (often translated as "happiness" or "flourishing") but Pearson argues that eudaimonia is only one of a plurality of goods that we desire (159-168). His account of epithumia and boulêsis are persuasive, but Pearson's account of thumos raises a few issues. He is right to reject the claim that the object of thumos is the kalon, but his own interpretation of thumos as a desire for retaliation is nevertheless problematic.

In chapter 5 Pearson points out that Aristotle often uses thumos and orgê interchangeably, which is one reason for thinking that the two terms are synonymous (111-117).[2] But there are passages where thumos and orgê do not appear to mean the same thing. Pearson addresses two passages in particular that could cause problems for his interpretation. The first passage is in the Topics where Aristotle describes orgê as in (en) the thumoeides (faculty or capacity of thumos), which suggests that orgê is not the same as thumos, but an actualization of the thumoeides (118; Topics 2.7, 113a36-b1, see also 4.5 126a10). The second passage appears in Politics 7.7, where Aristotle claims that thumos produces friendly feeling (philein) (1327b40-1328a1), but, as Pearson points out, there is no way a desire for retaliation could produce friendly feelings. In what follows I will consider Pearson's treatment of these passages, which I think despite his efforts still poses problems for his interpretation of thumos as a desire for retaliation.

Let us begin with the Topics. If we take thumos and orgê as synonymous in Topics 2.7, then all Aristotle means when he says orgê is in the thumoeides is that thumos is an actualization of the faculty of thumos, which Pearson acknowledges would be uninterestingly true (118). In order to avoid such triviality, Pearson claims that there is more than one way to understand the phrase "X is in Y." He points out that in Topics 4.5 Aristotle also describes fear as being in the thumoeides (118; Topics 4.5, 126a8-9). Fear cannot be an actualization of the thumoeides, according to Pearson (although it is not entirely clear why he thinks this), and so there must be another way to understand "being in the thumoeides"(118). If there is more than one way to understand the phrase "X is in Y," then Aristotle is merely setting up a contrast between different ways an emotion can be in the thumoeides. Some emotions, like anger, are an actualization of the thumoeides, whereas other emotions, like fear, are in the thumoeides in some other way. Pearson's main task in chapter 5 is to explain the way in which fear is in the thumoeides.

In order to understand the relationship between fear and thumos, Pearson turns to the Nicomachean Ethics where thumos appears to play a significant role in courage (119). He argues quite ingeniously that thumos is an "essential component" of courage for Aristotle because it regulates, and sometimes blocks, fear (126). Not all actions issuing from thumos will count as courage, but all acts of courage require thumos, according to Pearson. He states that "courage concerns standing up to one's fear; thumos is a natural desire that enables one to stand up to fear; so thumos can be a component of genuine courage, alongside choice and noble aim" (123). Pearson can now explain why Aristotle says that fear is in the thumoeidesin Topics 4.5. Fear is not an actualization of the thumoedies, but is instead regulated by the thumoeides (126). We now have two ways in which an emotion can be said to be in thethumoeides. While I find Pearson's discussion regarding the relationship between courage and thumos quite illuminating, I do not think he has proven that thumos is necessary for courage. Nor do I think there is good reason to think Aristotle is setting up a contrast between the way orgê and fear are in the thumoeides. I will mention just a few potential problems.

First, on Pearson's interpretation all acts of courage require a desire for retaliation. He claims that the desire for retaliation is especially important in the context of war (128-129). He claims that we see the enemy as "someone who has committed some injustice towards us, and this injustice needs to be rectified through warfare" (129). But fighting courageously in war does not seem like the kind of thing that could, for Aristotle, require thumos, understood as orgê. In Rhetoric 2.2 Aristotle claims that orgê is directed at an individual, not at groups of people. We get angry at Cleon, but not at man in general (1378a34). The desire for retaliation arises when we believe that we or our loved ones have been intentionally slighted by someone who has no right to do so (Rhet. 2.2, 1378a30-33). Therefore, in order for men to be motivated by orgê they must believe that they have been personally and intentionally slighted by each individual enemy soldier they encounter. It seems extremely unlikely that this is Aristotle's view. The desire for retaliation arises in the context of interpersonal relationships for Aristotle and does not appear to be a desire aimed at groups of people. Thus, while Pearson is right that the desire for retaliation can motivate courageous activity, it is unlikely that Aristotle thinks all courageous acts are prompted by a desire for retaliation (128).

A second potential problem with interpreting thumos as a desire for retaliation has to do with Aristotle's claim in Politics 7.7. He claims that "thumos produces friendliness (to philêtikon), for it is the capacity of the soul through which we feel affection (philein)" (129; 1327b40-1328a1). Pearson acknowledges that the passage in the Politics is incompatible with interpreting thumos as a desire for retaliation, but dismisses the passage as an isolated atypical case (130). He also claims that elsewhere Aristotle seems to associate friendly feeling with epithumia and boulêsis, rather than thumos (130). It is not clear, however, that Politics 7.7 is as idiosyncratic as Pearson suggests. If we look back at the passage in Topics2.7, we see that Aristotle entertains the possibility that thumos produces friendly feeling.

Again, if there be posited an accident which has a contrary, look and see if that which admits of the accident will admit of its contrary as well; for the same thing admits of contraries. Thus (e.g.) if he has asserted that hatred (misos) follows anger (orgê), hatred would in that case be in the spirited faculty (thumoeides); for that is where anger (orgê) is. You should therefore look and see if its contrary is also in the spirited faculty; for if not -- if friendship (philia) is in the faculty of desire (epithumêtikon) -- then hatred will not follow anger (113a33-b3).

In the passage above Aristotle is interested in contraries. He claims that the same thing admits of contraries. For instance, the same thing that is capable of becoming hot is also capable of becoming cold. Likewise, friendly feeling and hatred, being contraries, are either both in the thumoeides or in the epithumêtikon. According to Aristotle, it is not possible for hate to be in the thumoeides while friendly feeling is in the epithumêtikon. Aristotle's point in the passage above seems to be that because hatred and friendly feeling are contrary to one another they must belong to the same faculty or capacity.

Aristotle does not tell us in the Topics whether hatred and friendly feeling belong to the thumoeides or to the epithumêtikon, but if we look at the passage in conjunction with Rhetoric2.4, Aristotle's chapter on friendly feeling and hatred, we will see that there is reason to believe they do in fact belong to the thumoeides. Aristotle states in Topic 2.7 that hatred is in the thumoeides if it turns out that hatred follows anger. In Rhetoric 2.4 we learn that hatred does indeed follow anger (1382a1-20). If anger is in the thumoeides, then so are hatred and its contrary, which is friendly feeling. Thus, friendly feeling must belong to the thumoeides.

The passage in the Topics, read in conjunction with Rhetoric 2.4, makes the claim in Politics 7.7 a little more credible. Friendly feeling is in the thumoeides. Thus, Pearson needs to explain how thumos can produce friendly feeling and how friendly feeling can be said to be in the thumoeides if thumos is indeed a desire for retaliation. I suspect that thumos is not synonymous with orgê, but signifies a more general desire or capacity responsible for a number of other desires and emotions including, but not limited to, anger, fear, hatred, and friendly feeling. Despite these concerns regarding the chapter on thumos, Pearson's book is a welcome resource for those interested in Aristotle's psychology as well as those working on the philosophy of desire. I suspect it will spark many interesting debates concerning the nature of desire in Aristotle.

[1] Pearson focuses his attention on John Cooper's argument that thumos is a desire for kalon, although, as Pearson points out, a number of commentators have argued for this interpretation. See John Cooper (1999). "Reason, Moral Virtue, and Moral Value," in Reason and Emotion, Princeton University press, 253-80.

[2] For example, Rhet. 1.4,1369a4, 1369b11; 2.2, 1378a30-33, NE 7.5,1149a30. These are just a few passages that one may compare to see that Aristotle does use thumos and orgê interchangeably at times.