Aristotle on Earlier Greek Psychology: The Science of the Soul

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Jason W. Carter, Aristotle on Earlier Greek Psychology: The Science of the Soul, Cambridge University Press, 2019, 253pp., $99.99 (hbk), ISBN 9781108481076.

Reviewed by Jerry Green, University of Central Oklahoma


Book I of Aristotle's De Anima (DA) is an oft-neglected portion of the Aristotelian corpus, even among specialists in Aristotle's psychology. DA I is largely concerned with the views of Aristotle's predecessors, and many scholars have seen Aristotle's critiques of these views as unpersuasive, unmotivated, and perhaps even unfair, which in any case offer little insight into Aristotle's own thinking on the nature of the soul. Consequently, the literature on the DA tends to make a fresh start with DA II, relegating DA I to an ancillary status.

James W. Carter's book offers an overdue alternative approach to DA I, one which reads DA's first book as an integral part of the overall argument. Carter argues that DA I shows us how Aristotle came to adopt the positions of DA II-III, by working through the views of his predecessors and using their flaws to demarcate the space that the correct view would occupy. In other words, DA I allows us to get inside Aristotle's head and see him working through problems in psychology before he developed his own detailed solutions.

Carter's book is divided into four main parts, bookended by a substantive Introduction and Conclusion. Part I discusses Aristotle's own methodology and aims, claiming in particular that Aristotle views his predecessors as engaging in a scientific enterprise and therefore holds their views to scientific scrutiny. Part II explores how the soul is the source of motion, with chapters focusing on Plato, Democritus, Xenocrates, and the Harmonic Theory of the soul held by Pythagoras, Aristoxenus, and others. Part III deals with the soul as the source of cognition, focusing on Empedocles and Anaxagoras. Finally, Part IV engages with two of the most vexing puzzles in Aristotle's psychology, largely inherited from Plato: whether the soul is uniform, and whether it is divisible (these two chapters are a highlight of the book).

Chapter One focuses on Aristotle's methodology in DA. The crux of this chapter is the demonstrative heuristic, a test which Carter proposes that Aristotle uses to assess whether a putative definition of a given entity (which should refer to its essential, per se properties) succeeds by facilitating knowledge of that entity (36). The demonstrative heuristic is taken to be the solution to a specific pair of methodological problems: "(A) what is the proper method for discovering the essence of the soul, and (B) what are the starting points or premises from which that method begins" (22). The demonstrative heuristic does not answer these questions directly, but it does give us a tool to begin searching for the right answers (an investigation that continues throughout DA). This chapter also briefly argues against three alternative explanations of Aristotle's methodological comments in DA I, contending that neither induction, the endoxic method, nor strict dialectic are up to the task of discovering the essence of the soul.

Chapter Two focuses on the soul/body problem in DA. It introduces the Axiom of Causal Association (extracted not from DA itself, but from GC I.7), which states that an entity x can be by nature affected by another entity y if and only if x and y belong to a common genus but to opposite species (51). This axiom is used to set constraints on viable solutions to explaining how the soul relates to the body, and in particular how the soul can explain physical motion and perception. Carter applies the Axiom briefly to Plato and to proponents of the soul/craft analogy (52-55), and (in what I find to be a digression, albeit an interesting and informative one) to Cartesian dualism.

Chapter Three focuses on Aristotle's criticism of Platonic psychology, specifically the thesis from the Phaedrus and Laws that the soul is a self-mover. The overall argument of this chapter is that Aristotle rejects defining the soul as 'that which moves itself', which leads Aristotle to reject in turn the position that a soul is a corporeal. The bulk of this chapter is devoted to clarifying the possible ways in which 'that which moves itself' could be understood, which leads to a discussion of whether the soul is corporeal or spatial. Throughout, the point is that Plato's treatment of self-motion fails the demonstrative heuristic: it does not facilitate knowledge of the essence of the soul. The conclusion is that the soul cannot be defined as essentially self-moving, nor can it be understood as a body. Instead, Carter argues (drawing on material from outside DA) that Aristotle alludes to the position that the soul is a phusis of a body. This conclusion paves the way, eventually, for Aristotle's own view of hylomorphism presented later in DA.

Continuing the examination of physical theories of the soul, Chapter Four moves to Democritus and atomism. On this view, the soul is a special kind of spherical atom, and so also a certain kind of fire (82-83). Rather than attacking this view directly, however, Aristotle focuses on questions of application: how does this atomistic theory succeed in explaining important features of the soul such as life, movement, or perception and cognition? Carter reads Aristotle's criticism as directed toward a specific shortcoming, that Democritus's view cannot explain intentional action, not as an argument against materialism or atomism generally (a topic the arguments of Chapter Three would address instead). This discussion once again paves the way for Aristotle's own view, by showing that a successful theory of the soul must be able to explain intentional action as a source of motion without resorting to bare assertions of physical or mental/physical interaction.

Chapter Five shifts to the Academic philosopher Xenocrates and his view of the soul as a self-moving number. Carter holds that Xenocrates held two positions, Simple Platonism (that the Forms exist as separate substances) and Mathematical Platonism (every Form is a number generated from the One and the indefinite dyad); Plato himself held the former but not the latter. The soul, on this view, is a specific Form/number. Aristotle alludes to Xenocrates's view in the Topics and Posterior Analytics, treating the topic dialectically in those works. In DA, however, Aristotle focuses on problems resulting from conceiving the soul as a Form/number, in particular that the soul would be monadic or ontologically simple and hence (a) cannot explain motion, (b) cannot explain how souls are in bodies, (c) leads to the (by Aristotle's lights) unacceptable conclusion of panpsychism, and (d) ultimately fails to illuminate the essence of the soul (even if the Mathematical Platonist definition were ultimately correct). The discussion here is more speculative, given the paucity of source material to use as independent evidence. But like the preceding chapters, it provides constraints on the positive view Aristotle will ultimately propose: the soul is incorporeal, but we need options for understanding this incorporeality other than Platonic or mathematical Forms.

Chapter Six examines the Pythagorean view that the soul is a harmony. This view has the advantage of satisfying the Axiom of Causal Association, and can explain, for example, why the body decays after death. And in fact, this view begins to look like Aristotle's own Hylomorphism in some respects. But on Carter's reading, the Harmonic Theory of the soul does not reveal any essential features of the soul (as the demonstrative heuristic requires). Once again, however, the pros and cons of this theory point us in the direction of what the right theory must look like: it identifies a necessary feature of the soul (that it depends on appropriate bodily conditions), though it errs in identifying it as both necessary and sufficient.

Chapter Seven shifts the focus to Empedocles' theory of the soul; here the discussion moves from puzzles of psychic motion to the puzzle of thought and perception (which are treated together under the genus 'cognition'). The target here is the dictum 'like cognizes like', and Aristotle makes Empedocles the representative for other figures who also endorse this basic principle. According to Carter, Aristotle sees a number of distinct problems with this view (such as entailing panpsychism and failing to explain the cognition of composites and categories). Nonetheless, Aristotle finds something in the Cognitive Likeness Principle worth salvaging, at least once it is made to conform with the Axiom of Causal Association. This refined version of the Principle refers to the potentiality of becoming like the object of cognition, rather than the actuality of being materially like that object. This refinement adumbrates Aristotle's eventual commitment to the position that the soul takes on the form of the object it cognizes.

Chapter Eight moves on to Anaxagoras. This chapter is unique in that Carter reads Aristotle as a careful and sympathetic interpreter of Anaxagoras, and therefore as far less critical of Anaxagorean doctrine than of other views. Carter argues that Aristotle adopts Anaxagoras's view that the mind is unmixed with the body, and refines it to be consistent with his own commitments such as the Axiom of Causal Association. Aristotle's investigations here lead him to adopt the Separability Thesis (that the soul is not in an organ that mediates the objects it cognizes).

Chapter Nine shifts from discussion of specific thinkers to broader puzzles in philosophical psychology. The first puzzle concerns the soul's uniformity: is the soul simple by nature, or multiform? On Carter's interpretation, Aristotle argues that the soul is not uniform, a conclusion that might be surprising given the hylomorphic definition of soul that Aristotle eventually endorses. Carter's reading again relies on the demonstrative heuristic: Aristotle argues that two per se attributes of the soul, perception and motion, are not coextensive -- simple animals like sea urchins can have one but not the other. Indeed, plants are alive, and therefore have souls, despite lacking both these attributes. Supposing that these are in fact essential features of the soul, it follows that souls must be different in kind: non-coextensive per se attributes must belong per se to different kinds of soul.

Chapter Ten addresses a related puzzle: is the soul divisible? This puzzle is couched in Platonic terms, no surprise given its precedents in the Republic, Phaedrus, and especially the Timaeus. Carter introduces a useful distinction between two conceptions of parthood: (i) souls have spatial-parts if the soul can reside in different parts of the body, and (ii) souls have capacity-parts if it can be divided in a non-spatial way. On Carter's reading, Aristotle endorses the latter but not the former. The result is that a whole soul may be divided into different bodies (as when an earthworm is cut in two), but capacities of the soul will not be divided into distinct parts residing in different places in the body. Aristotle also rejects the possibility that the soul could have these capacities separate from the body (bracketing the thorny issue of mind or nous, not addressed in detail until DA III).

Finally, in the Conclusion Carter shows how Aristotle uses the results of his investigation of competing views of the soul in DA I to outline the contours of a correct view that Aristotle takes his own hylomorphic theory eventually to fill. In particular, hylomorphism satisfies the Axiom of Causal Association, by making both matter and soul species of the same genus, substance. On Carter's reading, this commits Aristotle to a certain kind of dualism, which he calls Associative Entity Dualism. The particular kind of association Aristotle has in mind, however, means that matter and soul are ontologically interdependent. In particular, different capacities of the soul require specific material conditions to be physically realized; for instance, visual perception, as a capacity of the soul, requires a specific body, the eye, with a specific material composition. The notable exception, of course, is nous or intellect, which functions independent of any particular material constitution (and, at least in the case of divine nous, independent of any matter at all). Carter deals with this tension in Aristotle's thought by reading it as having a narrow target: not that all kinds of soul belong essentially to bodies, but rather that souls as a kind belong naturally to bodies (222). This version of dualism is not trivial, and in fact places Aristotle's view much closer to Cartesian substance dualism than most commentators have been willing to accept. The result has an interesting consequence for Aristotle's philosophy of science. On this reading psychology will bifurcate, with what we might call animal psychology subordinate to physics or natural science, and human psychology (insofar as this focuses on intellect) subordinate to theology.

The book is a valuable contribution to Aristotle scholarship in several respects. It goes without saying that scholars of the DA will be challenged to engage more with the substance of DA I and have been given useful resources for understanding the discussion of the soul that emerges in DA II and III. Scholars who focus on other areas will also find this a worthwhile read. The discussion in Chapters 9 and 10 of the soul's uniformity and separability, respectively, are especially good: these chapters will be useful to anyone who deals with Aristotle's view of the soul, whether that it is the context of DA, or any of Aristotle's ethical works, or in his biology. The discussion of Aristotle's methodology will be useful to researchers interested in Aristotle's philosophy of science, both as he defines it and as he practices it. Commentators on pre-Socratic philosophy will find a careful discussion of Aristotle's treatment of his predecessors, which is more sympathetic than is often supposed. And those interested in the history of philosophy of mind will find an intriguing version of dualism emerging in the final chapters.

The broad appeal of this book is also, unfortunately, a partial weakness. Each chapter is relatively short, resulting in a comparatively slim volume. I suspect many readers will find the treatment of specific issues intriguing but incomplete. This is especially true for scholars of the pre-Socratics and Xenocrates: any addition to the literature on Xenocrates or Archelaus, for instance, is welcome, but specialists on these figures will not find quite the contribution that they may have hoped for in this text.

One could also worry about the methodology of this project. Carter's thesis that DA I should be read charitably, and makes important contributions to the rest of DA, is a welcome and well-defended position. All else equal, we should expect the components of a single text to function as a unity. But it is less clear how DA I connects to other parts of the Aristotelian corpus, and Carter frequently imports ideas from other Aristotelian texts to motivate readings of specific passages in DA. In some cases this intertextuality is well deployed (chapters 2 and 3 are particularly strong in this regard), but in other cases one is left wanting a fuller explanation for why we should think that text A is relevant to text B beyond the support that it gives to Carter's interpretations. Given that Aristotle seems to have changed his mind about at least some matters across the corpus (which Carter acknowledges in making is own reading of DA a developmentalist one (5)), it cannot be taken for granted that a passage from one work can be appropriately projected onto another work.

Nonetheless, this is a book worth reading. It makes a compelling case for an intriguing and plausible interpretation of Aristotle's own view of the soul, as well as his methodology in a specific science.