Aristotle: On Generation and Corruption, Book I, Symposium Aristotelicum

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Frans De Haas and Jaap Mansfeld (eds.), Aristotle: On Generation and Corruption, Book I, Symposium Aristotelicum, Oxford University Press (Clarendon Press), 2004, 360 pp, $74.00 (hbk), ISBN 0199242925.

Reviewed by Ian Mueller, University of Chicago


The first Symposium Aristotelicum met at Oxford in 1967, and has met every three years since then, once in the United States, but usually on the other side of the Atlantic. Its principal founders were Ingemar Düring, a philologist with an interest in philosophical texts, and G. E. L. Owen, later a professor of ancient philosophy at Oxford, Harvard, and Cambridge, certainly the most influential figure in his field during the last half of the twentieth century in the English-speaking world and perhaps in the whole world. Although the Symposium has seen some changes, its basic structure has remained importantly the same: a small self-perpetuating group of organizers, referred to by participants with a mixture of irony and resentment as the Nocturnal Council, who settle on a topic, determine speakers, and invite some other attendees, roughly a total of thirty people. Papers are distributed in advance to allow for extended discussion, and then revised for publication.

One of the notable changes in the Symposium has been its gravitation toward the Anglo-American sphere of influence. In the first six Symposia, less than a third of the papers were given by speakers from North America or the United Kingdom, whereas eight of the twelve contributors to the present volume reside in one of those two places, six of them in Cambridge (England), Oxford, or Princeton. Moreover, all papers in the last three published proceedings have been in English (I believe this is a requirement of the Clarendon Press), whereas in the first six well less than half were.

I want to mention one other change in the format of the Symposium. The first Symposia had relatively broad topics, "Aristotle and Plato in the mid-fourth century," "Aristote et les problèmes de méthode," "Aristotle on dialectic: the Topics," "Naturphilosophie bei Aristoteles und Theophrast." In the last five (including the one for 2005), the subject has been either a short treatise or one book of a treatise. Book 1 of On Generation and Corruption (GC) is the longest of the five texts chosen, 26 pages in the standard collected works of Aristotle in English. For the most part speakers are assigned a given stretch of text, usually a chapter. Obviously the demand is for a close reading of the text or, at least, the most interesting parts of it, but the goal is not to produce a commentary, but rather a series of interpretive essays setting out what prominent individual scholars can make of (very difficult) material assigned to them. The results will be of great interest to scholars and graduate students working on ancient natural science and philosophy. A review written for them would necessarily be overlong and excruciatingly detailed, and unlikely to affect their independent judgments of the volume. This review is aimed at a somewhat more general philosophical audience, and will mention only some of the major claims made in the essays.

In the Aristotelian corpus with which we work GC comes after the Physics and On the Heavens and precedes the Meteorology, the psychological works, and the biological works. In the Physics Aristotle discusses the principles of the study of nature, causation, change, infinity, space, time, and vacuum, and concludes with an argument that there is an unmoved first mover of the universe. The first two books of On the Heavens are devoted to the world above the moon, the remaining two to the natural motions of the four simple bodies, earth, water, air, and fire. In the second book of GC Aristotle discusses qualitative aspects of the simple bodies, treating each of them as involving "a certain matter which is not separate but always with a contrariety" (329a24-26) and a pair of contraries, one from the pair wet and dry, the other from the pair hot and cold. He describes the change of one simple body into another as a matter of the change of one of its contraries into its contrary, e.g., of wet into dry; these simple bodies are the components of everything from which other things are generated and into which they are destroyed. In the last three chapters of GC Aristotle says that this generation and destruction of things is ultimately due to the motion of the sun in the ecliptic. In the first three books of the Meteorology, Aristotle discusses phenomena which he considers to be sublunar, including comets, rain, and earthquakes. In the last book he takes up the processes involved in the formation and development of bodies such as oil, gold, wood, wine, and flesh; the four simple bodies and the basic contraries are fundamental to this discussion, but the contraries function much more like basic material stuffs than like the mere properties they appear to be in GC 2. The introduction of soul in the psychological works provides Aristotle with the basis for distinguishing living things from others and discussing such topics as nutrition and growth, perception, and thought. In the biological works Aristotle concerns himself with various kinds of animals, their parts, the mechanics of their motion, and their reproduction.

It can be seen that there is a general pattern to this sequence: a discussion of general principles in the Physics; a treatment of the superlunar realm, which changes only by moving; a treatment of the simple bodies in terms of their movements; then GC 1; then a treatment of the simple bodies in terms of their basic qualities and an explanation of the coming to be of things; then a discussion of sublunar phenomena not involving life; then an account of the interaction of the simple bodies; then an account of life and its fundamental distinguishing features; then a detailed account of the nature and development of particular living things. Roughly, then, the sequence is: most general principles of nature; highest, barely natural domain; natural domain treated in its least concrete aspect, motion; GC 1; most basic components of the sublunar realm; phenomena of the lifeless sublunar realm; most basic features of life; detailed discussion of living things.

How, then, does GC 1 fit into this scheme? I would respond, echoing the title ("Aristotle on the Foundations of Sublunary Physics") of Myles Burnyeat's introduction to this volume, that GC is a presentation of the general principles for studying the features of the sublunar world, other than those brought out in the treatment of the motion of the simple bodies in On the Heavens 1 and 2. To make this characterization more concrete I indicate the topics of the chapters of GC 1 before making a few remarks about the way they are treated in the current volume.

At the beginning of 1.1 Aristotle gives a very general description of his topic, the explanation of natural coming to be, and then (314a3-5) a more specific one: the definitions of change of size (growth) and of change of quality (alteration), and the question whether change of quality is different from generation, roughly speaking the question whether a thing's coming to exist is a matter of something's changing its characteristics. It seems fair to say that for Aristotle the distinction between generation and other changes, including alteration, is the distinction between something acquiring a new 'form' and hence becoming a new thing and something remaining the same thing while changing, say, its color or size or position (cp. 317a23-27). Chapters 1 and 2 are typical Aristotelian discussions of his predecessors. In 1.1 (discussed by Jacques Brunschwig) he rejects the views of both the monists because they must treat generation as alteration and the pluralists, particularly Empedocles, who, he says, is obligated to distinguish generation and alteration, but, in fact says the opposite and even contradicts himself. In 1.2 (discussed by David Sedley) Aristotle rules out the idea that generation is the combination of particles by attacking the very idea of atomism.

Chapters 3-5 carry out the program set out at the beginning of 1.1. In 1.4 (discussed by Sarah Broadie) Aristotle characterizes alteration as occurring "when a substratum which is perceptible remains but changes in its affections (these being either opposites or intermediates); for example, a body is healthy and then sick while remaining the same, and a round bronze thing is at some time round angular, but it is the same" (319b10-12), but his main concern is with the question of the difference between alteration and generation. This question cannot be treated separately from the issue of 1.3 (discussed by Keimpe Algra): is there any such thing as generation? Aristotle's answer to this question is affirmative, but Aristotle's explanation of his answer is inscrutably torturous. Both Broadie and Algra focus on the issue of prime matter (traditionally the "matter which is not separate") and its (possible) place in Aristotle's ontology, as does David Charles in a separate chapter on simple generation and prime matter. Finally in 1.5 (discussed by Alan Code) Aristotle treats growth, focusing on the case of an animal's growing as a result of taking in food, and stressing that this growth is not a case of adding bits of matter here and there; rather the subject of growth is the animal as a whole and its form. The focus on animal growth is one indication of the difficulty of my characterization of the general program of Aristotle's writings on nature. One would expect a more general account of growth than Aristotle gives, including, say, the expansion of water when it freezes. Equally puzzling perhaps is that in On the Soul 2.4 the soul is said to feed the body with food, but there is no mention of the soul in GC 1.5. Perhaps we can say that, despite the obvious focus of the chapter on the growth of living things and its invocation of form, Aristotle is still abstracting from the fundamental role of the factor which makes them living things and hence capable of growing, that is, soul.

At the beginning of chapter 1.6 (discussed by Carlo Natali) Aristotle describes what is to come. He looks ahead to the discussion of GC 2.1-4, and then says that it is necessary to first speak about certain things which have only been described (presumably by others) in an indeterminate way:

For all those who generate the elements as well as those who generate the bodies that are compounded of the elements make use of dissociation and association, and of action and being acted on (passion).

Action and passion are the topic of chapters 7, 8, and 9 (discussed by Christian Wildberg, Edward Hussey, and Michel Crubellier respectively). To explain the reason for discussing mixture, the topic of GC 1.10 (discussed by Dorothea Frede, with an additional essay on mixture by John Cooper) Aristotle says simply:

Now association is mixture, but the meaning of mixture has not been clearly explained.

Finally he explains the need for the discussion of contact (aphê), which forms the rest of GC 1.6:

But if we must investigate action and passion and mixture, we must also investigate contact. For things which cannot be in contact with one another cannot act or suffer, nor can things mix unless they have first been in contact in some way.

I shall not discuss the essays on chapters 5 to 9 further, except to say that I found the essay on 5 more than usually cogent and insightful and the essay on 8 extremely useful for its analysis of the chapter and of the way the chapter fits with other Aristotelian material.

The essays on chapters 1 and 2 make use of philological maneuvers to extricate Aristotle from charges of intellectual chicanery. Brunschwig suggests not only that Aristotle has given an implausible account of Empedocles as someone who must say something, but, in fact says the opposite, and also contradicts himself, but also that Aristotle found the account unsatisfactory and gave up on it (in some sense which is not entirely clear to me), so that 1.2 is the "real" begining of GC. Sedley addresses the issue of the extent to which the argument or arguments for atomism which Aristotle presents are his own creation. He argues that if five lines, 316b9-14, which contain the Aristotelian term 'potentially' are moved 14 lines further back, one can distinguish between a Democritean formulation of the argument, which Aristotle rejects, and Aristotle's attempt to give Democritus a better shot at his target, a shot which Aristotle also turns away. No doubt different scholars will react differently to these attempts to keep our image of Aristotle polished.

According to what is called the traditional view, Aristotle did believe in prime matter, but, as one author puts it,"today the politically correct view appears to be that there is no such thing as prime matter in Aristotle at all" (91). Most of the contributors to the volume successfully avoid the issue of prime matter, but I noticed only one person who states any doubts about the rejection of the tradition (40-42), as against four who do reject it explicitly. Aristotle has no need to invoke prime matter to account for any change except possibly for the change of one simple body into another, of which I have already given a (politically incorrect) characterization. It is not my intention to defend that characterization, but only to claim that a discussion of prime matter ought to start with an account of GC 2.1-4 and determine the place of that account in Aristotle's writings on nature and, in particular, its relationship not only to GC 1, but also to Physics 1.7-8, where Aristotle appears to say that every change involves a substratum and a pair of contraries, and Meteorology 4, where, as I have suggested, Aristotle's treatment of the simple bodies and basic contraries has a quite different odor from GC 2.1-4. Of the opponents of the traditional conception of prime matter in the present volume Broadie says that GC 1.4 "presents a different and more developed picture of change than <Physics 1.7-8>," (129) and finds it difficult to believe that if at the time of writing the Physics chapters he had a definite view about a distinct structure of generation he would not have expressed it (130). She offers an elaborate defence of the view that the transformation of simple bodies is a matter of one substratum being substituted for another. On the other hand, Algra, who appears to hold a similar view of simple-body transformation but stresses that he is only talking about GC 1.3 (94), claims that it and Physics 1.8 are not inconsistent because they represent "different levels of analysis" (117). Frede argues that the simple bodies are nothing more than a pair of qualities "with no underlying matter" and that "'prime matter' is nothing but the potential of the simple bodies to engage in different basic combinations" (304; Frede's italics). Finally Charles, who offers reasons for rejecting Broadie's position (168), develops a global alternative account of prime matter, according to which it is an abstract or logical entity, not a material one. I do not think this account is plausible, but it brings to the fore the broad range of interpretation to which some Aristotelian doctrines or alleged doctrines can be subject.

I want to conclude this review by a considering the alternative accounts of mixture put forward by Frede and Cooper, and then making a more general remark. Mixtures in the relevant sense are so-called homoiomerous compounds of the simple bodies, such as flesh and blood, which are for Aristotle infinitely divisible and which are such that any part is "like" the whole. Frede defends a standard account of Aristotle's picture of mixture in GC 1.10, according to which, when the simple bodies mix (as opposed to transform into one another), their qualities somehow combine to form new qualities making up a new homoiomerous material. According to the traditional view, apparently accepted by Frede, every piece of a homoiomery, such as flesh, is not only qualitatively like every other, it is also materially the same: it is flesh. Cooper concedes that Aristotle may be committed to this view in GC II.8, but insists that on the most plausible reading of 1.10 Aristotle denies the material uniformity of homoiomeries. Personally, I think the standard view is right here. Aristotle never says or implies in 1.10 -- nor should he -- that in mixtures of the simple bodies, "the ingredients come to be altered in their perceptible properties (while somehow retaining their identities as distinct ingredients)" (321; my italics). All Aristotle is committed to in 1.10 is that when a homoiomery is dissolved the simple bodies can emerge in the same amounts as when they started to mix; he does not say, and, I think, should not say, that the identical simple bodies can be recovered.

On the other hand, I think that on the most plausible reading of Meteorology 4, the descriptions of processes that Aristotle offers entail that homoiomeries are not homoiomerous in the material sense (and perhaps not in the qualitative sense either). Here I disagree with Frede's claim (312) that there is no "real incompatibility" between GC and the Meteorology. I cannot discuss question of compatibility in this review, but I do want to point to the broader question raised here and elsewhere in this review concerning the place of GC in the general scheme of Aristotle's physical writings. In his introduction Burnyeat represents the Physics as providing the conceptual foundation for all the physical writings and, as I have indicated, GC as providing the conceptual foundations for the study of the sublunar world. On the relation between these two works Burnyeat says: "The puzzle is that the concepts under discussion GC> are ones we are supposed to be familiar with from our reading of the Physics … It is as if we had to retrace our steps and problematize concepts we thought we had learned. But it is important to appreciate that Aristotle's aim is not just to problematize these concepts. They are to be shaped for the specifically Aristotelian theoretical use to which they will be put throughout the physical works, up to On the Soul and beyond" (16; Burnyeat's italics). The same, I think, can be said about the relationship of GC to the subsequent physical works. But the question that has to be asked is 'What is involved in shaping?' We have seen in connection with this volume that even questions of consistency can be raised about Aristotle's treatment or use of the same concepts in different passages. The detailed study of, say, a chapter written by Aristotle no doubt contributes to determining that text's relationship to its broader context and the whole corpus. But I am inclined to think that we will not make real progress toward understanding relationships of this kind until we have a generally accepted notion of what it is for Aristotle to reshape a concept already explained for other specific theoretical uses.