Aristotle on Inquiry: Erotetic Frameworks and Domain-Specific Norms

Aristotle On Inquiry

James G. Lennox, Aristotle on Inquiry: Erotetic Frameworks and Domain-Specific Norms, Cambridge University Press, 2021, 320pp., $99.99 (hbk), ISBN 9780521193979.

Reviewed by Sylvia Berryman, The University of British Columbia


James Lennox’s new book on Aristotle’s scientific method takes on a perennial blister, the apparent disconnect between Aristotle’s most programmatic remarks on the nature of philosophical inquiry in the Posterior Analytics, and his own practice in particular treatises. The unifying theme of the book is that while Aristotle maintains a commitment to the existence of domain-neutral norms of inquiry—those found in Book Two of Posterior Analytics in particular—he also relies heavily on domain-specific norms for the conduct of particular studies. Investigating the methodological commitments in Aristotelian texts concerned with specific fields of inquiry is thus necessary to fill in the apparent lacunae left by Posterior Analytics. It’s a compelling thesis that carves out a direction for scholarly work on Aristotle’s method.

The big idea is that Aristotle’s most general remarks on inquiry are necessarily limited in scope, since specific subject matters require different approaches. In Prior Analytics 1.30, Aristotle says, after all, that many principles of the various sciences are domain-specific. Lennox reasons that we should expect the methods of inquiry to be so too (34). Lennox explains the sparse explicit discussion of this dual approach to inquiry in Aristotle by the simple fact that there is very little to be said about it at an abstract level. Aristotle’s rejection of general reductionist programmes—such as those of the Pythagoreans or materialists—is cited as evidence that he saw different inquiries as having diverse subject matters. At the same time, Lennox argues, epistemological issues shape the methods of inquiry in specific disciplines. Disciplines like geometrical optics are also necessarily self-limiting in that they adopt a particular perspective, moreover, investigating only some part of the nature of rainbows, for instance, such as their geometry and not their colours (5).

Acknowledging and indeed embracing the common complaint that Posterior Analytics works at a ‘rarefied plane of abstraction,’ (1), Lennox directs the reader to the domain-specific norms that can be teased out of the more specific inquiries, rather than expecting a uniform method to be articulated that would apply in all fields of inquiry. In particular, Lennox questions the expression of disappointment that Aristotle has little to say about the process by which we reach causal explanations, apparently resorting to some ‘flash of recognition’ as the process by which we grasp the relevant explanatory term. Instead, Lennox argues that the domain-specific norms are intended to flesh out the ‘erotetic framework’ provided by Posterior Analytics, providing more content for causal reasoning in ways appropriate to the diverse subject matters at hand (64). The notion of ‘metalevel norms’ (37) frames the issue in more familiar language, and is explored further in chapter two.

Lennox, as a leading scholar of Aristotelian science, especially his biology, is well-placed to guide us through the existing literature on Aristotle’s ‘scientific method.’ The opening chapter provides a historical overview of some major interpretative schools of thought about Posterior Analytics (17–32) that tried to fit Aristotle’s method into modern categories. Lennox takes us through the various proposals laid out by the lions in the field during the last three decades of the twentieth century: Aristotle has variously been interpreted as a coherentist, a rationalist, an empiricist, and an advocate of a kind of inference to the best explanation. Lennox presents David Charles’s work Aristotle on Meaning and Essence (2000) as a ‘game changer’ (32), unifying the message of Book 2 of Posterior Analytics into a single narrative rather than reading the last chapter in isolation. But even Charles’s account, Lennox argues, fails to provide a sufficient account of the process of moving from one stage of inquiry to the next. This is where Lennox proposes a change of course, looking for the contents of Aristotle’s method of inquiry in particular studies rather than in his programmatic work. The perceived inadequacies and interpretative difficulties of Posterior Analytics result from bringing mistaken expectations to the work, rather than seeing it as a mere skeleton to be fleshed out in domain-specific ways.

Lennox is at home with the intellectual background that informs these interpretative debates, and deploys it well in untangling the gaps between Aristotle’s own expectations of knowledge and those of his twentieth century readers. Lennox challenges the once-common practice of explaining the anomalies in Aristotle’s account as a reflection of the differences between the context of discovery and that of justification. He also points out the degree to which some readers of Aristotle’s method of achieving knowledge have stumbled over their own, modern theory of the difference in kind between perceptual awareness and belief (35). Through most of the book, though, the focus is on Aristotle rather than on his interpreters. While clarity is sometimes helped by keeping the central narrative free of undue entanglement in scholarly controversies, more attention to the recent literature seems warranted (e.g., 47n16; 102–3nn6–7), especially where these studies heave closer to Aristotle’s own categories than to modern questions about scientific method.

Lennox makes few concessions to beginners, such as his nice example of the vintner’s daughter (62). The more abstract discussion can indeed get quite dense without these, and I found the use of ‘commensurate’ to describe what seem to be coextensive categories puzzling (59–64). It may be Chapter Three, on the term methodos itself, that offers the most accessible route in to Lennox’ proposal. Beginning with a philological survey of the history of the term, Lennox notes two distinct ways Aristotle uses it, to refer to the process or the product of inquiry, a duality also found in the modern term ‘science’ (100). Inclusion of the ethics texts in this discussion suggests that Lennox intends to include practical inquiries in his skopos, despite the main focus of the book on treatises in the natural sciences.

Part Two, with its detailed studies of particular methodologies, helps make good on the promise of Lennox’s thesis. These norms can, Lennox argues, be inferred from the implicit method used in specific inquiries as well as the critique of methodology employed by others, supplementing the sometimes scant remarks on method found in introductory books of particular inquiries. Seeing how Aristotle responds to these challenges and contributes to the development of the idea of investigative methods is the real payoff. The study of On Respiration is a particularly strong example of the benefits of Lennox’s approach. Although Lennox mentions the critique of errors of his predecessors as one of the sources of methodological reflection (3), there is less of this than one might anticipate in the book, as it would surely help to make concrete the implications of Aristotle’s particular commitments (cf. 268ff). The comparison between the methodological commitments expressed in two different works, On the Soul and Parts of Animals, lends some specificity to the general thesis (193–8).

An important sub-topic, the order of inquiry and the extent to which results from one field can be employed in another, plays a supporting role in the inquiry. Lennox highlights a debate between Martha Nussbaum and Joan Kung on Aristotle’s willingness to allow conclusions from one field to be imported into another, in the context of Motion of Animals, since the issue of interdependence is pertinent to any consideration of the relationship between different fields of inquiry. Two chapters in Part Two concern the interdependence of otherwise relatively autonomous disciplines. The danger of any deep dive into this topic, however—such as the discussion of Meterology IV—is that the narrative loses focus on questions of methodology to immerse itself in substantive questions.

Does Lennox make the case that Aristotle has a systematic approach that is carried out consistently throughout the corpus? Given the unevenness of the Aristotelian corpus itself, we might still wonder whether the language of an ‘erotetic structure’ (174) to Aristotle’s inquiries is a little overstated. Overall, nonetheless, it seems a promising research programme, and there is much scope for further inquiry in a similar vein. The rich analysis of Aristotle’s method for investigating embryos by starting with a number of eggs equal to the days of gestation and examining one per day (80–81) is a particular gem, and a reader might wish for more such concrete examples of Aristotle’s methodological innovations. How did he investigate the density of a medium, or the success of political constitutions, or address the problems of studying anatomy of dead specimens? Lennox focuses rather more on reading texts than on addressing these kinds of problems, and it’s understandably difficult at times to see the forest for the trees. Indeed, a single volume could hardly encompass the variety of studies that would be required to do justice to such a proposal.

The work draws on Lennox’s lectures and published work from the past dozen years: it’s more than a collection of essays and somewhat less than a monograph, since the process of developing individual chapters for independent publication does impact the unity of the overall narrative. Nonetheless, there is a synthetic vision to the book that is both hard won and honestly earned in the trenches of the detailed studies. The volume is nicely assembled, with useful features like running headers and comprehensive indices that maintain a high standard of scholarship.

This book isn’t for the beginner: readers need to be familiar with the basics of Aristotelian syllogistic demonstration, know their way around the Aristotelian corpus, and have some previous familiarity with scholarly discussions of methods of inquiry. For specialists, however, it offers a way of reconceptualizing Aristotle’s approach to inquiry. The difficulties stem from the subject matter itself, and such a constructive proposal is very welcome. The book contains a wealth of thoughtful and patient work on difficult questions, and any scholar in the field will want to study it.