Aristotle on Perceiving Objects

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Anna Marmodoro, Aristotle on Perceiving Objects, Oxford University Press, 2014, 291pp., $74.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199326006.

Reviewed by Mark A. Johnstone, McMaster University


In this important new book, Anna Marmodoro considers Aristotle's theory of sense perception, focusing especially on his views on the unity of the perceptual faculty. Marmodoro's main goal is to defend a "metaphysically robust" interpretation of Aristotle's views on the "common sense," which she claims performs functions irreducible to those performed by the five individual senses. She argues that Aristotle needed to posit a genuinely unified common sense to account for the possibility of "complex perceptual content," by which she means content that incorporates input from more than one sense. In taking this stance, she defends what might be considered a more traditional view of the common sense and its role in perception for Aristotle, in self-conscious opposition to the more deflationary approaches favored by some recent authors (e.g., Gregoric 2007, Johansen 2012). In addition, she offers a detailed explanation of Aristotle's "subtle" perceptual realism, an explanation that is grounded in her careful analysis of Aristotle's theory of causal powers.

In a long first chapter, Marmodoro considers the "metaphysical foundations" of Aristotle's theory of perception. While it is difficult to do justice here to this chapter's careful discussion of complex issues in Aristotle's metaphysics, its main claims include the following. According to Marmodoro, Aristotle advanced a "pure" power ontology, on which reality is fundamentally comprised of powers (dunameis), beginning with the hot, cold, wet and dry. All properties are causal powers, and all causation is to be understood in terms of actualization or activation of these powers (e.g., a hot thing exercises its power by heating something else). A power is a capacity to bring about change, either by effecting it (an "active" power) or undergoing it (a "passive" power). For a power, reaching its end ("unfolding" its potentiality) is exercising its powerfulness by being activated. Active powers depend on passive powers for their activation, and vice versa. Change results from the "partnering" of active and passive powers, under suitable conditions. The actualization of a power is not a new property, but the same power at a higher level of activity. Powers are not relational properties, but relatives: their ontological interdependence is grounded on monadic properties, like "being a mother" and "being a daughter," not on reified relations. Partner-powers realize their natures in activities that are coextensive in time: the asymmetry of causal relations is explained by the active-passive contrast, rather than by temporal priority. Finally, the co-realization of distinct but paired powers is a single change, occurring "in" the patient.

Although it is presented as background for the discussion of perception, this first chapter is of considerable independent interest. Marmodoro builds her case systematically and writes engagingly and accessibly, given her subject-matter. Her general stance is that Aristotle held a powerful and coherent view that compares favorably with attempts to develop power-based ontologies in contemporary metaphysics (she discusses such views extensively in the notes). The discussion may therefore be relevant not only to ancient philosophers, but also to anyone working on the metaphysics of dispositions and powers.

In the next two chapters, Marmodoro argues that Aristotle's general metaphysics of causal powers provides him with resources to develop a distinctive, sophisticated and "subtle" form of perceptual realism. According to Marmodoro, Aristotle regarded the perceptible qualities of objects as real features of the world, namely, powers to interact with perceivers in specific ways. For example, on this view, a color has (or is) a power to be seen, a power which is activated when it pairs with the perceiver's capacity to see, which is exercised through the eye. The activation of these powers is numerically a single event, occurring in the perceiver. Aristotle's distinctive way of thinking about causal relations thus allows him to maintain that perception provides genuine access to mind-independent reality.

Marmodoro is surely right to insist that Aristotle was a perceptual realist, who believed perception puts us in touch with real features of mind-independent reality. Her particular interpretation also has some distinctive and attractive features. First, on her account Aristotle occupies sensible middle ground between (i) the view that the world contains no colors or sounds in the absence of perception, and (ii) the view that these qualities exist in a "full-blooded" way even when not being perceived. This is because, on her account, sensible qualities are powers, and powers can exist at differing levels of activation: sensible qualities achieve their highest and fullest activation when actually making themselves be perceived, but remain the very same powers even when no perceiver is present.

Another notable feature of Marmodoro's view is her account of the causal efficacy of sensible qualities. On her interpretation, Aristotle regarded sensible qualities as "multi-track" powers: single powers that manifest themselves in multiple ways. Some interpreters (e.g., Broadie 1993) have argued that for Aristotle the activation of a power can only bring about a single effect, so that if (for example) a color is a power to cause vision, it cannot bring about any other effect qua color (e.g., a material change in the perceiver's sense organ, or in the perceptual medium). Against this view, Marmodoro first highlights passages in which Aristotle apparently allows sensible qualities to have effects other than causing perception (p. 128). She then argues that there is in any case no need to attribute such restricted causal efficacy to sensible qualities, since (again) the same causal power can exist at different levels of activation. Aristotle was therefore able to hold that one and the same sensible quality can cause effects on inanimate things at one level of activation, while causing perception only at another, fuller level of activation.

Of course, perception puts us in touch not only with a disjointed array of distinct sensory qualities, but also with objects, which we perceive through multiple senses as unities that have sensory qualities. Furthermore, we ordinarily perceive objects as having not only those features we access only through a single sense (the Aristotelian "special sensibles," such as colors, sounds and smells), but also those features we can perceive through multiple senses (the Aristotelian "common sensibles," such as shape, size, and movement). How does Aristotle account for these facts? Answering this question occupies Marmodoro for the remainder of her book (chapters 4-7), and may fairly be regarded as her central goal.

Essentially, Marmodoro argues that Aristotle responded to this challenge by attributing to the perceptual faculty as a whole a distinctive kind of unity. For Aristotle, on her account, our perceptual faculty is no mere aggregate of the five individual senses; but neither does it subsume the five senses in such a way as to undermine their distinctness. Rather, Aristotle posited a "common sense" (aisthêsin koinên) in addition to the five individual senses, which performs various functions no individual sense can perform on its own. These functions include simultaneously perceiving qualities belonging to different sensory modalities, discriminating between them, "binding" them together into a single perceptual content, and perceiving the "common sensibles," features of objects that can be perceived through more than one sense. These functions all involve complex (i.e., multimodal) perceptual content. For this reason, Marmodoro argues, no one sense could perform them -- for Aristotle was firmly committed to the view that no one sense can access sensory qualities that are special and exclusive to any of the other four senses.

Perhaps the greatest strength of this third part of the book is Marmodoro's clear presentation of the challenge Aristotle faced in accounting for complex perceptual content, given the structure of his theory. On Aristotle's view of perception, causal interactions between the special sensibles and the five senses are fundamental to our perceptual experience of the world. Each sense is defined as the power to perceive a certain kind of special sensible, while the special sensibles just are powers to act on perceivers to make themselves be perceived; the resulting causal interaction underpins Aristotle's perceptual realism. However, Aristotle was well aware that perceivers also have single perceptual experiences with content derived through different sensory modalities. Aristotle's theory therefore requires that the inputs of the different sensory modalities be unified at some common point. Marmodoro persuasively argues that any adequate interpretation of Aristotle's theory must accommodate this idea of a single center of perceptual experience, and that those that fail to do so neglect the sophistication and interest of his eventual view.

Yet while Marmodoro does an excellent job of framing the issue, her account also has some less satisfactory features. First, in the final two chapters Marmodoro depicts Aristotle as wrestling with the challenge of accommodating complex perceptual content by trying six possible metaphysical "models" for understanding the unity of the perceptual faculty. She argues that the first three models fail, but in instructive ways, as Aristotle himself recognized, while the last three all include elements of Aristotle's own eventual view. The discussion here is sophisticated and fascinating, and Marmodoro successfully highlights the interest of the passages she cites. Nevertheless, one might still query her way of treating these passages in relation to each other. The passages in question are drawn from different works, which (as she admits) were not written in the order in which she presents them. The problem is that Marmodoro's presentation gives the impression that Aristotle addressed this issue far more systematically than he appears to have done. She also fails to explain why Aristotle's remarks on the unity of the perceptual faculty were so scattered and inconclusive, or why his final, considered view did not appear in De Anima (the passage she discusses last, and leans on most heavily, comes from De Somno, a work generally thought to predate De Anima).

My second concern is with Marmodoro's treatment of Aristotle's view on the perception of common sensibles -- that is, perceptible features that can be perceived by more than one sense, such as shapes, magnitudes and movements. Marmodoro argues that each of the five senses perceives the common sensibles only partly, and that we perceive them fully only through the common sense (pp. 171, 174). She motivates this view by arguing that it reconciles Aristotle's claims that we perceive common sensibles through individual senses with his claim that we perceive them through each sense only incidentally, all without turning the common sense into a sixth sense. However, one might question whether perceiving something partly is a way of perceiving it incidentally, for Aristotle. Moreover, I found the notion of a sense achieving only a "partial grasp" of an object difficult to understand. If (as Marmodoro appears to maintain) one sense operating alone always has an inaccurate grasp of a common sensible, what is the precise nature of the error? After all, it might seem that we sometimes perceive (e.g.) a shape quite well using only a single sense modality, such as sight or touch. Furthermore, how many different senses must be employed to fully (as opposed to partly) grasp a common sensible, on her account? Additional clarification on these points would, I think, have been both appropriate and helpful.

I also wonder whether Marmodoro adequately captures the nature of common sensibles for Aristotle, and their relationship to special sensibles. As Marmodoro notes, Aristotle claims that common sensibles "accompany" (akolouthounta, DA 425b5) the special perceptibles. She unpacks this claim by proposing that for Aristotle common sensibles are "ways in which the special sensibles are clustered together" (pp. 176-77). However, this idea -- that the common sensibles are just modes of arrangement of the special sensibles -- threatens to undermine Aristotle's view that common sensibles are perceptible "in their own right" (kath' hauta, DA 418a8-11). We might also wonder how special sensibles, understood as powers, should be envisaged as "clustered together." I hazard that a more promising approach here would be to maintain that common sensibles are ontologically independent from special perceptibles, but are accessed only through them. In other words, information about the common sensibles is received in the sense organs together with information about the special perceptibles, but must be teased out by a further, "common" operation of the perceptual faculty considered as a whole. This would do justice to the language of accompaniment and the primacy of the special sensibles, while avoiding conflating the status of common sensibles in the world with our mode of access to them in perceptual experience.

Finally, Marmodoro claims that for Aristotle the common sense is "the perceptual system as a whole, comprising the five senses but empowered with extra perceptual capacities" (p. 157, emphasis original). This may well be right as far as it goes: there are good reasons to think Aristotle sometimes envisaged the perceptual capacity as a unitary whole, and that he attributed to it powers exceeding those attributable to the individual senses. However, in developing and defending her view, Marmodoro fails to fully explain the nature of "the perceptual system as a whole," and the basis of its "extra" capacities. For example, many passages suggest Aristotle regarded the perceptual system as realized physiologically in various peripheral sense organs connected by "passages" (poroi) to a central sense organ (on his view, the heart) (e.g., Juv. 1, 467b28, Somn. 2, 455a33-34, Insomn. 2, 459b1-7). This provides a clear physiological basis for Marmodoro's claims about the overall unity of the perceptual system. However, such passages are discussed nowhere in this book. Furthermore, Marmodoro frequently claims both that the common sense is "constituted of" the five individual senses, and also that it possesses new powers over and above theirs; yet she never explains the kind of constitution in question or how it generates new, irreducible, higher-order powers (indeed, the language of "emergence" and of "higher-order" powers is strikingly absent from her work). This is not so much a criticism as an expression of puzzlement at the way she ultimately presents Aristotle's positive view.

This is an excellent book on a topic of considerable historical and ongoing philosophical interest. It is well organized and well written, and its central claims and lines of argument are easy to follow. These main claims are frequently highly original, while the problems with competing views are clearly explained. The book reflects a great deal of work and thought by Marmodoro on the topics it treats. It should serve as a touchstone for debates about Aristotle's general theory of causal powers, his perceptual realism, and his views on the unity of the perceptual faculty for many years to come.


Broadie, Sarah, "Aristotle's Perceptual Realism," Southern Journal of Philosophy 31 (Supplement) 1993: 137-59.

Gregoric, Pavel, Aristotle on the Common Sense, Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2007.

Johansen, Thomas K., The Powers of Aristotle's Soul, Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2012.