Aristotle on Practical Truth

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C.M.M. Olfert, Aristotle on Practical Truth, Oxford, 2017, 260 pp., $74.00, ISBN 9780190281007.

Reviewed by Joachim Aufderheide, King's College London


This study aims to show that the notion of practical truth is indispensable to Aristotle's ethics. It pursues its goal in six chapters. The first two, introductory, chapters -- one on Plato and one on misinterpreting Aristotle -- prepare the ground for the core of the book, a sustained treatment of Aristotle's conception of practical truth. Chapter three is a lightly revised version of Olfert's prize-winning article 'Aristotle's Conception of Practical Truth' (JHP, 2014), arguing that practical truth is both truth in the proper sense of 'truth' and a special kind of truth. Chapter four spells out the connection between practical truth and the other functions of practical reason, explaining how wish, decision, and action all express practical reason's concern for practical truth. The last part of the book, chapters five and six, draw out the implications of taking practical truth to be among the primary notions in Aristotle's moral psychology. Olfert first examines how pleasure can contribute to the development of truth-oriented practical reason, and then concludes by arguing that developing practical reason can also change what we enjoy.

The book is written in an engaging style. Although most of the references to Aristotle's text are given in the footnotes, the book does not suffer from footnoteitis, nor from a lack of textual work. The relevant literature tends to be discussed in the main text, usually in a charitable way. Olfert's exegetical claims are always well-founded, though sometimes controvertible (as to be expected). The argument as a whole follows a well-conceived plan. I enjoyed reading the book, and expect others interested in Aristotle's ethics to do likewise. Those who indulge themselves will learn much about Aristotle's moral psychology, and practical reason in particular. Most, I predict, will take the notion of practical truth more seriously than they used to. Whether readers will follow Olfert in promoting practical truth to one of the key notions in Aristotle's ethics -- on a par with, if not above, deliberation, practical reason, and pleasure -- will depend on the readers' other commitments. The great merit of Olfert's book is to spell out a plausible and in many parts quite persuasive way of doing so.

For the purposes of this review, I shall not go into the details of exegesis. Instead, I shall concentrate on the main lines of the argument to bring out both what is distinctive about Olfert's interpretation, and where one might hesitate to follow her. Chapter one traces the Platonic roots of what Olfert takes to be central to Aristotle's conception of practical reason, the unification of good practical agency and the pursuit of truth. In the Republic, practical and epistemological success are inseparable (14). In order to act well, we must grasp the truth. We need to know the form of the good in order to act as best we can. Olfert finds a similar position (sans forms) in two further dialogues. In the Protagoras, the art of measuring is not instrumental to other goals, but is constitutive of good action. The art is both a kind of knowledge and action -guiding. The Charmides also presents discovering the truth and avoiding error as constitutive of a good life. Correct actions consist, in part, in being knowledgeable actions. So, again, knowledge is not instrumental to acting well (and the resulting benefits), but part of it.

To what extent does Aristotle take over and develop Plato's thoughts on combining truth and action? The answer is complicated by a challenge contained in the Republic. As is well known, Plato distinguishes between different functions of cognition via their objects. He seems to separate belief from knowledge by assigning different objects to them (what is both true and false vs what is true, Republic V). But it seems as if only belief has to do with what is changeable, and hence can be action-guiding. Moreover, some pursuits of knowledge do not seem to be essentially practical. Famously, Plato's philosophers do not seem motivated to put their knowledge to practical use. They would rather contemplate than rule. To clear the way for attributing a plausible view to Aristotle, Olfert argues in chapter 2 against other interpreters who attribute a Plato-inspired 'Object View' to Aristotle on the strength of EN VI.1 (that EN VI = EE V is noted and set aside in Olfert's study). We should understand the difference between the calculative and the scientific part of reason not in terms of the objects each can cognise, but rather in terms of what they investigate. Calculative reason investigates the truth about what is changeable, but can rely on unchangeable truth. This way scientific or theoretical insights are not barred from making their way into practical thinking. In particular, deliberation may be informed by insight about human nature (60-1).

Now, even though Aristotle does not face the two-world problems that may lurk in the Republic, I am not sure this move addresses the underlying issue. According to the account of practical reason found in the Charmides and the Protagoras -- call it 'Socratic' -- I pursue truth and knowledge worth their salt if and only if I pursue acting correctly. And the knowledge is worthwhile because it directly translates into living well. By contrast, the Platonic account in the Republic maintains only one direction of the bi-conditional: if I pursue acting correctly, then I must pursue truth and knowledge. But I can pursue knowledge without thereby pursuing acting well, as the reluctant philosophers show. As far as I can see, Olfert presents Aristotle's view only as a continuation of the Socratic view, but not as a response to the Platonic one. Naturally, this leaves Plato's problem untouched. However, since there is a kind of knowledge that is not essentially linked to acting well, concerned with a kind of truth in comparison to which practical truth pales (as Aristotle maintains in EN X.7-8), it is not clear that practical truth is worth pursuing -- and we're back at the reluctant philosophers. In fact, one might think Aristotle's sharp distinction between practical and theoretical wisdom heightens the tension between pursuing theoretical and practical truth. Did Aristotle ignore Plato's problem? Whether we answer 'yes' (with Olfert) or 'no' has important implications for our interpretation of practical truth, as I'll argue below.

Olfert offers her novel and interesting interpretation of practical truth in chapter 3, according to which 'practical truth is the truth about what is unqualifiedly good for a particular person when all of her particular circumstances are taken into account' (105). On the basis of EN VI.2, and an interpretation of the argument at 1139a21-30 in particular, she argues for five desiderata a good interpretation of 'practical truth' must satisfy (86-92):

1. Priority: we can't ground the distinctness of practical truth in the distinctness of practical reason (we're trying to find out what practical reason is via the notion of practical truth).

2. Function-specifying: the notion of practical truth must help establish practical reason as a distinct form of reason.

3. Truth: the notion of 'truth' in 'practical truth' must be the same notion of 'truth' Aristotle uses elsewhere, not some derivative or degenerate version.

4. Practicality: one must explain how this truth is practical.

5. Unity: one must explain how 'action and truth' are the remit of practical reason.

Unsurprisingly, previous interpretations do not do the job properly (92-104). By contrast, Olfert's new interpretation accounts for the five desiderata. The key is that a single standard -- the unqualified human good -- is responsible for the truth of the reason-component in a good decision, for the correctness of the desire, and for their agreement. However, the unqualified human good does not feature in the abstract. Rather, it is a particularised version of it, 'this is good without qualification' in this circumstance relative to the agent (114-6). So, since we have a standard combination (x is F), the assertion can be true or false. Olfert resorts to the 'guise of the good account of rational motivation' [GGRM] to explain how the assertion can also be inherently practical: A is moved to pursue x if and only if A finds x good and practicable (122). If we cognise 'X is good', we are thereby motivated to act (if x is practicable). If practical truth has the form 'x is good', then the truth of the assertion is both practical and explains how a concern for it is at the same time a concern for action (127). We could see this view as a continuation of the Socratic picture sketched above, as it makes 'the good' achievable in action and a desire for it central.

Olfert's attractive interpretation illuminates the obscure notion of practical truth and sets out clearly, and in detail, how to think about it. However, merely seeing the Socratic aspect of Aristotle's project, and downplaying Plato's problem, might leave out an important aspect of 'practical truth'. According to her reading of 1139a21-30 and especially desiderata 1 and 2, practical truth should come out as a distinct kind of truth. But what sense can we make of 'kinds of truth'? Olfert stresses the difference between practical and theoretical truth, arguing that both the reason- and the desire-component of practical truth belong to one normative family which does not include theoretical truth. While 'practical truths are made true . . . by the same thing that makes our desires correct', theoretical truths do not share this relationship to our desires (107). Thus, stressing the practicality of practical truth to motivate the different kind of truth drives a wedge between theoretical and practical truth -- and thereby aggravates rather than assuages Plato's problem. But what if Aristotle tries to address Plato's problem?

There is another, more Platonic, way in which we can make practical truth a kind of truth distinct from ordinary true assertions. This interpretation starts by noting that Aristotle speaks of 'truth' (alêtheia) that is practical, not merely truths (as Olfert often does). Elsewhere in the Corpus, Aristotle uses alêtheia as an accolade for intellectual achievement (e.g. Met. II. 993b19-31). 'Truth' in this sense differs in kind from standard semantic truth. As Olfert herself notes, mere truth (such as 'x is good') is not the goal of practical reasoning, but involves also some kind of explanation (87), i.e. some cognitive achievement. But only when a) practical reason grasps what is semantically true and b) the desire is concordant with it, does it deserve the accolade alêtheia, because only then can the truth of the reason-component be counted as success properly speaking.[1] Presenting the success of practical reason as practical truth thus enables Aristotle to stress that arriving at practical truth is a kind of knowledge worth its salt. Practical reasoning results in practical truth, where the truth is a genuine intellectual achievement, comparable (even if inferior) to the achievements of theoretical reason. Thus, the point of calling the goal of practical reason 'practical truth' would be to bring successful practical reason closer to theoretical reason, not to separate them further, as on Olfert's interpretation. If so, 'practical truth' would not play the key and defining role that Olfert assigns to it, but would rely on a previous understanding of practical reason. Whether Aristotle really tackles Plato's problem through developing a notion of practical truth cannot be developed here. But I hope raising the alternative brings out Olfert's commitment to the Socratic heritage of Aristotle's conception of practical truth, and what hangs on it.

Chapter 4 expands on the role of GGRM to explain away an apparent tension in Olfert's interpretation. Her account makes a concern for practical truth the defining function of practical reason. But if the good of a thing is found in the function, then the good of practical reason should be an excellent grasp of practical truth. Now, Aristotle says the end is acting well, but acting well is not the same as practical truth (130-1). Olfert spells out clearly how to respond. All the functions involved in action (especially wish, deliberation, and decision) aim at grasping the truth about what is good to do in this situation. Since the functions are geared towards action, and in particular because action expresses the decision, action expresses a concern for practical truth. So, action may be said to be the end of practical reason, 'because it is the ultimate culmination of our concern for practical truth' (166).

The final two chapters address the connection between practical reason and pleasure. Chapter 5 asks how it is possible that pleasure can contribute to developing practical wisdom. According to Olfert, pleasure can feature properly in truth-directed methods such as induction or dialectic only if pleasure itself is a source of practical truth. The crux is to make pleasure a mode of cognition in which things seem good to us (179). More particularly, pleasure is an experience or appearance of unqualified goodness (182), in the light of our own condition. Thus, pleasure has content, namely what is good without qualification. The content 'x is good' is truth-apt (188), and when x is practicable, it is practical truth. Olfert's interesting account of pleasure goes far beyond the text. Unlike Plato, Aristotle does not speak of true or false pleasures, but of good and bad pleasures or primary and secondary human pleasures (X.5).

In any case, there is a question about the extension of true pleasures. Olfert suggests a pleasure is true if and only if a good person would enjoy it. Does this mean a) what a person who is good would enjoy (e.g. eating a cookie, provided it is permissible), or b) what a good person qua good would enjoy (virtuous action, widely understood)? If the latter, we could line up the notion of true and false pleasure with Aristotle's primary human pleasures, pleasures characteristic of the good person. But then we face a problem. If only the good person can enjoy true pleasures, pleasure could hardly help develop practical wisdom. Olfert solves the problem by distinguishing between true and expert experience of pleasure -- another distinction extraneous to the text. For the former you don't need to appreciate all the relevant features of the situation so that even less-than-virtuous people can enjoy and learn from them. Still, the pleasure stems from what the good person would do (196).

Chapter 6 tackles a question surrounding Aristotle's account of habituation. In the process of learning, sometimes pleasure and pain need to be reversed (e.g. learning to share with others), sometimes we need to enjoy new things, and we need to learn to enjoy fully virtuous actions. But, Olfert asks, how do I learn to enjoy like a virtuous person if I am not already virtuous (226-7)? I am not convinced that framing the question in terms of habituation goes to the heart of the matter. After all, according to Aristotle, pleasure completes/perfects an activity. So, if we learn to do the right actions, and in the right way, pleasure will automatically complete them. The real question, and the one Olfert answers, goes deeper. How is it that pleasure follows on those "new" actions (cf. 226)? Olfert proposes that rational thoughts about what is good without qualification can become internalised through (mental) practice. In the process, what is good without qualification starts to seem to us good without qualification. Due to GGRM, when x strikes us as good without qualification, we enjoy x (233). Like many other interesting proposals put forward in the book, one could work this out more thoroughly (in particular, what is the role of experience?). I highlight this not as a criticism, but as an endorsement. It is a virtue of the book that it gives a comprehensive and sustained treatment of Aristotle's notion of practical truth that raises many interesting avenues for further thought -- without necessarily pursuing all of them. For example, working out how Olfert's interpretation sits with the various accounts of the practical syllogism, and how we can explain the acratic's failure would be worthwhile projects. Achieving the goal of sparking serious engagement with her argument is well within the reach of Olfert's excellent study.

[1] Sarah Broadie, ‘Practical truth in Aristotle’, American Catholic Philosophical Quarterly 90 (2): 281-98, develops in detail the interpretation to which I allude.