Aristotle on Practical Wisdom: Nicomachean Ethics VI

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C. D. C. Reeve, Aristotle on Practical Wisdom: Nicomachean Ethics VI, Harvard University Press, 2013, 280pp., $39.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780674072107.

Reviewed by Corinne A. Gartner, Wellesley College


This is a new translation of Nicomachean Ethics VI, accompanied by a concise facing-page analysis, a thorough commentary, and a philosophically rigorous introduction from which seasoned Aristotle scholars, moral philosophers, and students alike stand to benefit. C.D.C. Reeve's book is not just (nor even primarily) a translation: the commentary is the longest section of the book, and the combination translation and analysis section is only around 40 pages long, as is the introduction. The book can stand alone as a substantive and illuminating series of philosophically-rich comments, but in conjunction with Action, Contemplation, and Happiness, the companion volume of which it was originally a part, it affords the reader further evidence to support the interpretation found there.

The central focus of the work is a systematic, holistic reading of Aristotle's account of practical wisdom within the framework not only of his ethics but, more broadly, his epistemology. The main picture that emerges is one according to which Aristotle understands ethical knowledge as a kind of (conditional) scientific knowledge, on the model of the other sciences (theoretical and natural), all of which are demonstrative in form. Hence Reeve's is a reading that looks to preempt some of the difficulties that arise in attempting to unify ethical prescriptions, which obtain only for the most part, and their theoretical starting-points, as well as those that arise in trying to specify the places of both practical wisdom and theoretical wisdom in achieving happiness. The project is thus surprisingly broad in scope, given the fact that it is a translation and commentary. However, as I will touch upon briefly, for all his attention to detail in the insightful and provocative commentary, one should not expect to find fully developed arguments in defense of each of Reeve's interpretive moves nor arguments that tie all of these moves together in a volume of this kind. This is, of course, not to be taken as a failing on the part of the author, but rather a function of the type of book that this is.

One might be skeptical of the need for yet another translation of the Nicomachean Ethics or some part thereof. But Reeve adopts a fresh approach to reading the particularly terse (even for Aristotle) and prima facie piecemeal sixth book, relying almost exclusively on the Greek text of Bywater's Oxford Classical Text, that (impressively) avoids privileging his interpretation. Translators of Aristotle are forced to decide whether to sacrifice maintaining the order of clauses in Greek and word-for-word correspondence between Greek and English for the sake of producing the smoothest and most natural-sounding English, or whether, on the contrary, to prioritize conserving not only the direct and elliptical style but also the technical vocabulary of Aristotle's Greek. Reeve takes up the second strategy, but still manages to make the text lucid and readable. He does not polish away potential points of issue, instead rendering the Greek with characteristic literalness, consistently using the same English terms to translate Aristotle's technical vocabulary and preserving as much as possible the ambiguities present in Aristotle's text so that readers without Greek will be able to formulate their own interpretations.[1]

'Practical wisdom' translates phronêsis, 'theoretical wisdom' sophia, 'virtue' aretÄ“, 'understanding' nous, 'cleverness' deinotÄ“s, 'craft' technê, 'mean' meson, 'state' hexis, 'activity' energeia, and so on. In general, Reeve elects orthodox translations of Aristotle's Greek terms, more often than not with extensive notes in the commentary that include alternative translation options and an explanation of how Aristotle seems to be using a given term by reference to a number of other contexts in which it occurs. In particular, horos as 'defining-mark' [96-99] and ergon as 'function' [108-113] receive excellent, elaborate discussion detailing the merits and drawbacks of competing options. Where possible and reasonable, Reeve has translated Greek terms with their English cognates -- e.g., architectonic for architektonikos and syllogism for sullogismos. All of these decisions make the edition accessible to non-specialists who may have some familiarity with these conventional terms in Aristotelian ethics, and who will find these standard translations in other scholarship on Aristotle's ethics.

Rendering archê as 'starting-point' rather than 'principle', prohairesis as 'deliberate choice' rather than just choice or decision, haplôs as 'unconditional' rather than 'unqualified' or 'without qualification', and epistêmê as 'scientific knowledge' (and sometimes just as 'science' when modified) as opposed to 'systematic knowledge' or just 'knowledge' are somewhat less commonplace, and one might worry that translating epistêmê in this way biases the reader in favor of Reeve's view, as he seeks to bring ethical knowledge under the umbrella of demonstrative scientific knowledge. The worry quickly dissolves as soon as one realizes that here, too, Reeve is merely following Aristotle's own usage consistently, charitably presupposing systematicity on Aristotle's behalf: epistêmê occurs throughout the corpus, applied variously to different domains of knowledge (theoretical, practical, and productive).

The merits of Reeve's approach are apparent upon comparison with three other leading translations. Consider the following representative passage from the beginning of Chapter 8 (1141b23-8), where Aristotle addresses the relationship between practical wisdom and political science.

First, here is W.D. Ross as revised by J. O. Urmson (in the Princeton Complete Works of Aristotle, ed. Jonathan Barnes):

Political wisdom and practical wisdom are the same state of mind, but to be them is not the same. Of the wisdom concerned with the city, the practical wisdom which plays a controlling part is legislative wisdom, while that which is related to this as particulars to their universal is known by the general name 'political wisdom'; this has to do with action and deliberation, for a decree is a thing to be carried out in the form of an individual act.

Next, Terence Irwin in the second edition of his translation (Hackett, 1999):

Political science and prudence are the same state, but their being is not the same. One type of prudence about the city is the ruling part; this is legislative science. The type concerned with particulars [often] monopolizes the name 'political science' that [properly] applies to both types in common. This type is concerned with action and deliberation, since [it is concerned with decrees and] the decree is to be acted on as the last thing [reached in deliberation].

This is Christopher Rowe's version (in Sarah Broadie and Christopher Rowe, Oxford, 2002):

Political expertise and wisdom are the same disposition, but their being is not the same. Of the disposition as it relates to the city, the architectonic form of wisdom is legislative expertise, while the form of wisdom at the level of particulars is given the generic name 'political expertise', and this is concerned with action and deliberation, since a decree is something to be acted upon, as what comes last in the process.

And now Reeve's translation, which is elegantly faithful to the original Greek:

Political science and practical wisdom are the same state, but their being is not the same. Of the practical wisdom concerned with the city, the architectonic part is legislative science, while the part concerned with particulars has the name common to both -- "political science"; this part is practical and deliberative, for a decree is doable in action, as the last thing.


Reeve's rich commentary chooses not to engage much with the existing secondary literature[2], but it incorporates a wealth of material from Aristotle's non-ethical works (including the Organon, the Metaphysics and treatises on natural science) and, in so doing, provides the pieces for a convincing case that Aristotle is not speaking loosely when he calls ethics a kind of scientific knowledge. Although some syllogisms are theoretical -- an operation of theoretical wisdom in the virtuous case, concluding in propositional knowledge -- while others are practical -- an operation of practical wisdom, the virtue of the deliberative part of the soul, in the virtuous case, concluding in action -- both nonetheless operate demonstratively; that is, practical wisdom produces its own demonstrations, albeit of a weaker sort than those that theoretical wisdom provides.

The crux of Reeve's reconciling interpretation is a distinction between unconditional and conditional scientific knowledge, which allows him to read passages throughout Book VI that apparently put practical wisdom at odds with scientific knowledge as generating opposition only with unconditional scientific knowledge. While unconditional scientific knowledge has unconditionally necessary starting-points and is the exclusive purview of theoretical wisdom, conditional scientific knowledge, such as knowledge of natural sciences and ethics, has conditionally necessary starting-points, since they hold only for the most part. On a first-pass reading of NE VI, in Chapter 3 Aristotle claims that scientific knowledge is about things that are by necessity and do not admit of being otherwise, in Chapter 4 we learn that things attained in action do admit of being otherwise, and in Chapter 5 Aristotle concludes from these considerations, and others, that practical wisdom cannot be scientific knowledge. But Reeve explains, "Since scientific knowledge, as defined in Chapter 3, is the unconditional sort found exclusively in the theoretical sciences, it is the only sort practical wisdom is being denied to be." (157, my emphasis)

Another central piece of Reeve's account is the notion of practical perception, the objects of which involve pleasure or pain as well as (somehow) good and bad, and the deliberative variety of which enables an agent to act directly as the conclusion of a practical syllogism. (208-210) The role of practical perception in motivation and action generation, and the general picture of motivation in the background, could be clearer. In some places, Reeve writes as if practical perception is itself motivating. (He calls practical perception "desire-infused" [12] and claims that desires are "motivating modes of perception" [7].) In others, it seems as though practical perceptions may cause desires, which are then responsible for motivation. (He says that our practical perceptions, "include elements that perforce instill desire because they are already either pleasant or painful, good or bad." [208, my emphasis]) And in one place Reeve suggests that what "finally causes" an agent's action is orexis (a term Aristotle applies to desire in general), which he analyzes rather idiosyncratically as a resultant of rational wish and non-rational, appetitive desire, rather than treating rational desire and appetitive desire as two types of orexis, each of which is motivationally sufficient.[3] (206)


The introduction admirably balances expository remarks about Aristotle's ethics geared toward a wide readership, emphasizing, as one would expect, the nature and place of practical wisdom in living well, on the one hand, with sophisticated scholarly discussion that frequently takes a stand, usually without acknowledging it as such, on some of the most controversial scholarly debates in the interpretation of Aristotle's ethics, on the other hand. The former aspect of Reeve's discussion is his focus in the final section of the Introduction ("Aristotle's Ethical Thought in Perspective" [28-41]), which succinctly situates Aristotle's views (or, more precisely, Reeve's interpretation thereof) within the landscape of normative ethical theorizing. He argues that Aristotle's account of practical wisdom straddles the generalism-particularism divide: it is generalist insofar as normative authority stems from universal ethical principles, codified in ethical science, and particularist insofar as acquiring and then applying knowledge of these principles requires perception of particulars, making particulars both the source of universals and the truth-makers for inferential propositions drawn from them. (31) The latter, interpretive aspect of Reeve's introductory discussion, however, raises a number of difficulties, a couple of which I now briefly address.

First, the way that Reeve characterizes completeness of virtue and ends in the Eudemian Ethics is open to question. Although he is rightly sensitive to the fact that Book VI of theNicomachean Ethics is a common book (Books V, VI, VII of the NE = Books IV, V, VI of the Eudemian Ethics) and undertakes a laudably far-reaching comparative assessment of the extent of continuity in doctrine across Aristotle's ethical treatises, including not only the EE but also the Protrepticus and Magna Moralia, Reeve claims that Aristotle's Nicomachean view of completeness of virtue resolves a tension present in the Eudemian version. But this claim rests on introducing a difficulty into the Eudemian account that the text does not warrant.

On Reeve's reading of the EE, Aristotle thinks, inconsistently, that (a) the end -- complete virtue -- consists solely of phronêsis and the natural virtues of character, and (b) contemplative activity, which is not a component of phronêsis or virtues of character, is constitutive of happiness (the end). We can avoid contradiction by denying (a): one could hold that, in the context of EE II 1, Aristotle understands "complete" virtue of the soul -- which he identifies as happiness[4] -- as the full complement of human virtues, virtues of thought together with virtues of character, treating these two types of virtues as parts of a whole.[5] As Reeve acknowledges (23), Aristotle equates happiness with "activity of a complete life in accord with complete virtue."[6] In the argument that follows this claim, Aristotle first distinguishes, as he does in NE I 13, between the two parts of the soul that share in reason, and then goes on to analogize body and soul: just as a good constitution in the case of the body consists in the virtues of its separate parts, so too the end of the soul -- happiness -- consists in the virtues of its parts (just distinguished), which Aristotle then specifies as virtue of character and virtue of thought.[7]

The solution, explains Reeve, to the problem that he has developed is that, in the NE, Aristotle operates with two conceptions of completeness -- part-whole completeness and valuecompleteness -- the second of which is not to be found in the EE. The sense in which a life of contemplation in accord with theoretical wisdom is complete is that it is value complete because it is the highest or most valuable sort of virtue.[8] (26) He concludes:

By recognizing two different types or grades of happiness, one incomplete, constituted by activity in accord with full virtue of character, another complete, constituted by activity in accord with theoretical wisdom, with the first being for the sake of the second, the Nicomachean Ethics avoids [the difficulty present in the Eudemian Ethics]. (28)

To fill out Reeve's view of happiness in the NE, we would need to see his answers to controversial interpretive questions. Is the highest form of happiness singularly constituted by activity in accord with theoretical wisdom? In what way is the first sort of activity (activity of character virtue) for the sake of the second (theoretically virtuous activity)? And, as I have suggested, we can avoid interpreting the EE as inconsistent.

Second, there is a related set of issues that concern the way Reeve seems to construe the aim of practical wisdom, and the relationship between the happiest and the second-happiest human life. For he states that, "practical wisdom should maximize the cultivation of character, and its virtues," (18) but then goes on to explain that it should aim at theoretical contemplation. Though there is no contradiction between maximizing character cultivation and aiming at theoretical contemplation, a further story is required to explain how aiming at contemplation of divine, eternal, unchanging beings will result in, or at least not detract from, maximizing the sort of virtue that one exercises on a quotidian basis in the polis. (Indeed, bringing together practical wisdom and theoretical wisdom by positing theoretical wisdom, or the virtuous activity of theoretical understanding, as the end at which practical wisdom is directed [170-171] is hardly to prevent the apparent rift between these two sorts of virtuous activity in relation to eudaimonia.) How is deliberately choosing to perform virtuous activities of character, which are in accord with a human being's nature as a political animal, supposed to further the contemplative ideal?

Moreover, Reeve makes the second-happiest human life out to be a failed attempt at the first-happiest, explaining that, due to unpredictable and unfortunate circumstances, a virtuous agent who performs activities of character virtue that aim at theoretical contemplation may not secure adequate leisure time for contemplation, but her intrinsically valuable virtuous activities of character will nonetheless constitute the second-best sort of happiness. (18) There is little room on this picture for the agent who structures her life in accordance with the virtues of character, taking activity of practical rather than theoretical wisdom as her end and attaining the end that she sets. It is unclear why we ought to prefer a reading on which the second-happiest life finds the virtuous agent missing the mark to one on which the second-happiest life is a life led in a deliberately and thoroughly political way.

[1] Readers might compare Reeve’s style of translation to the style he adopts in his authoritative translation of Aristotle’s Politics (Hackett 1998) and expert revised translation of Plato’s Republic (Grube and Reeve, Hackett 1992).

[2] Reeve justifies his methodology in the preface (x), where he explains that he does not contend with other interpretations because, “So numerous, various, and complex are these, however, that such an account would tax all but the most committed, fail to convince the invested, and soon be out of date.”

[3] Reeve relies on a single passage from the Metaphysics (XII 7 1072a27-8) to support the suggestion that we should understand orexis as the resultant of appetite and wish, but, in context, it is unclear that this is the way to read the passage. One could, instead, read desire (orexis) as being consequent upon (i.e., the resultant of) belief. Furthermore, Aristotle elsewhere explicitly indicates that orexis comes in three types, wish (rational desire), appetitive non-rational desire, and spirited non-rational desire (see, e.g., de Anima II 3 414b2, III 9 432b5-10, 433a22-6; EE II 7 1123a26-7, II 10 1225b24-6; Politics VII 15 1334b17-25; Rhetoric I 10 1369a1-4).

[4] EE II 1, 1219a27-8.

[5] I am thus in agreement with Reeve that Aristotle is operating with a part-whole conception of completeness in the Eudemian Ethics. The matter up for dispute is the way in which this conception of completeness is related to the end, happiness.

[6] EE II 1 1219a38-9.

[7] EE II 1, 1220a3-5.

[8]  The passage from the Metaphysics (V 16 1021b12-17) that Reeve invokes as evidence reads ([26], his translation): “We call [part-whole] complete that outside of which not even one part is to be found, as, for example, the complete time of each thing is the one outside of which there is no time to be found that is part of that time, and we also call [value] complete that which, as regards virtue or goodness, cannot be surpassed relative to its kind, as, for example, a doctor is complete and a flute-player is complete when they lack nothing as regards the form of their own proper virtue.” But Aristotle does not commit himself, in this passage, to the notion that virtue is itself one of the kinds which, as regards virtue or goodness, can be complete or incomplete, and, one could argue, the examples given—the virtues of a doctor or flute-player—more naturally lend themselves to an analogy with human virtue, or virtue of the kind human being. We would therefore need to marshal further evidence before accepting Reeve’s conclusion that, “Theoretical wisdom is more complete than virtue of character as a whole, then, because relative to the kind virtue, it cannot be surpassed in value.” (26)