Aristotle on Religion

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Mor Segev, Aristotle on Religion, Cambridge University Press, 2017, 192pp., $99.99 (hbk), ISBN 9781108415255.

Reviewed by Lloyd P. Gerson, University of Toronto


In this concise and focused monograph, developed out of a Ph.D. dissertation at Princeton, Mor Segev examines Aristotle's views concerning religion both in the poleis of his own time and in his proposed ideal version. Part of the difficulty faced by the author, and acknowledged as such, is that the word "religion" does not correspond exactly to anything in ancient Greek. What Aristotle talks about is the bureaucratic office of epimeleia for ta hiera, approximately the "management of holy matters". Perhaps a contemporary label for such an office would be "ministry of religious affairs". This would include overseeing certain holidays, the construction and care for temples, the provision of priests, and the interface between theological doctrine, on the one hand, and civic and criminal law on the other. All of these are civic practices, serving at the very least to instill in members of the political community some sort of esprit de corps. In a modern secular governmental structure, the concerns of this "ministry" would overlap to some extent with those of a "ministry of education". These practices must be distinguished from the theological reflection underlying them, whether this comes from poets or from philosophers. In fact, one not entirely misleading account of the birth of philosophy in ancient Greece is that it was constituted in part by the substitution of a critical philosophical or rationalistic theology for the poetic theology of Homer and Hesiod. Consequently, when investigating what Aristotle has to say about these matters in general, it is important to keep distinct his views on the social and political aspects of "religious affairs" from his philosophical work on divinity or the ultimate principles and causes of the cosmos.

The problem that motivates Segev is this. Aristotle is highly critical of the anthropomorphizing of divinities, pervasive throughout Greek culture. He thinks not only that the stories told about the traditional gods are absurd, but that these gods do not exist, though he is prepared to allow that certain myths about the gods are possibly more edifying than others. So, Aristotle thinks that Greek "religion" is mostly irredeemably false. And yet Aristotle insists that an ideal polis will necessarily have a minister of religious affairs. So, the question that arises is, Why does Aristotle think that this is necessary or even desirable? While recognizing that Aristotle allows that traditional religious practices can be useful for rulers to keep the populace in line, Segev thinks that the main reason why Aristotle insists on the necessity for a constitutionally mandated office of religious affairs is that the practices overseen by this office will inspire some few individuals in the polis to wonder about larger metaphysical issues. This wonder, along with a supposedly enlightened rejection of traditional religion itself, will lead these few individuals to the contemplative life. Since Aristotle regards this as the best sort of life, and since he thinks the ideal polis should be constructed with a view to making this life available to people, he wants traditional, albeit false, religious beliefs to pervade the polis so that they can stimulate metaphysical reflection. Segev concedes that there is no evidence for this interpretation in the extant corpus of Aristotle's writings (p. 52). He thinks, though, that this interpretation is "strongly corroborated" by Strabo (64 BCE - 24 CE) who, in his Geographia, expounds on the value of myth, not just for instilling fear in people, but also for educational purposes (p. 62). But the achievement of these educational aims does not clearly line up with the very specific bios or way of life that Aristotle calls "theoretical". Strabo thinks that the educational value of myth is broad, certainly broader than the highly refined and idiosyncractic value that Segev claims Aristotle finds in these myths. Even so, Segev speculates that Strabo might have gotten his idea about the educational value of myth from a "relevant lost work" of Aristotle.

In the first chapter, Segev gives an account of Aristotle's reasons for rejecting traditional religion. As he demonstrates, Aristotle's rejection follows from his own scientific philosophy, especially as this is found in his physics, ethics, and metaphysics. In particular, one of the hallmarks of the traditional gods or the traditional hierarchy of gods, is that these gods are providential. Merely denying this providence, even at the same time as one insisted on the existence of the gods, was sufficient for being branded an atheist. This was apparently the fate of Epicurus. Within Aristotle's physics, although teleology has a prominent place, providence does not. Personal providence, at any rate, is indistinguishable from chance.

But personal providence does not exhaust the possibilities, as the Stoics maintained. A sort of universal providence, ensuring the harmonious and continuous interaction of all the parts of the cosmos is difficult to tease apart from the comprehensive causality exercised by Aristotle's unmoved mover. Segev dismisses Aristotle's comparison of the unmoved mover to a general in the 10th chapter of the twelfth book of his Metaphysics as impossible to square with his unequivocal rejection of anthropomorphic deities (p. 20). But given the Stoic example, this dismissal may be premature. It is salutary in this regard to read the Stoic Cleanthes' Hymn to Zeus to see the possibility of a non-ironic, sincere embrace of the affective side of traditional religion along with the philosophical oriented denial of personal providence. Segev is right to conclude that Aristotle does not have a teleological argument for the existence of god or the gods (p. 41) and also that, for this reason, belief in the traditional gods on the basis of a teleological argument is "quite problematic as a source of knowledge about reality" (p. 47). But he certainly does have a cosmological argument for the existence of the unmoved mover and that argument does at least invoke global teleological considerations at the conclusion of his Metaphysics.

In the second chapter, the author faces the problem of what use Aristotle thinks traditional religion has, given its falsity. It is fair to say that Aristotle devoted more than a passing thought to a "ministry of religious affairs" in constructing his ideal polis. But it is also worth emphasizing that Aristotle, more or less the inventor of political science, rooted his idea of the ideal polis in his meticulous empirical investigation of the constitutions of more than 150 contemporary poleis. Although these are all lost to us -- with the exception of the constitution of Athens -- it is very likely that all of these constitutions made provisions for religious affairs to be looked after in one way or another. Aristotle says in passing that a tiny polis might collapse all the religious functions into one office whereas a large polis might apportion them out to several different offices. I take this to be Aristotle expressing the results of his empirical investigation. So, Aristotle's ideal state assumes the material component of the hylomorphic political composite, namely, ordinary human beings. He aims to fashion the ideal by optimizing the formal component, something less grandiose than Plato had in mind in Republic, but probably came to accept in Laws. And it must have seemed to him that traditional religious practices are bound to exist in any polis and that they should be put to the best possible use. In addition to instilling obedience to the law for fear of divine retribution, Aristotle, as Segev shows, also acknowledged in his Nicomachean Ethics the exemplary possibilities of traditional religion (pp. 79-80). Aristotle uses the word "divine (theion)" as a positive term, both within a moral and intellectual context. Accordingly, the imitation of the divine is to be recommended. But it is difficult to see the point of the exhortation to imitation both if the gods do not exist and if, as Aristotle says, they surpass all moral virtue at least. Imitating their intellectual virtues makes good sense; imitating the moral virtues which are irrelevant to their immortal lives does not.

In the third chapter, the heart of the book, Segev wants to argue that the feature of traditional religion that is indispensable to the state is that it will inspire some to seek out the true causes of things. That is, it will lead an intellectual cadre of citizens into the theoretical life. As Segev says, quoting the Nicomachean Ethics, the best life for a human being is the divine life, the life that the unmoved mover has. It is a life spent in contemplation of the highest matters, which is exactly what the unmoved mover does when it contemplates itself. To institute practices and policies that open up this possibility for some "constitutes the ultimate sociopolitical role for the practice of traditional religion" (p. 89). Since, however, the traditional gods do not exist, they serve merely as avatars for the true god or gods of philosophy. So, whenever Aristotle makes a statement about the divine, we must understand him to be including the traditional gods, even though they are fictional (p. 96). These gods serve as "practice material" for philosophical aspirants to chew on, ultimately to be cast aside when one achieves the status of a more sophisticated and enlightened philosopher.

In the fourth chapter, Segev turns to a discussion of the traditional religious myths themselves, and how they might be useful in the polis. He cites a number of texts in which Aristotle is prepared to accept certain underlying truths contained in some myths, truths about the nature of the cosmos and the nature of personal relations. It is possible, Aristotle says, to separate the underlying truths -- including non-metaphysical truths -- from the fictional shroud (pp. 127-128). These traditional repositories of "hidden" truth can serve a heuristic function along with their serviceability in maintaining social cohesion. But even myths which contain not even a grain of truth can be of value since they can instill a sense of wonder in those to whom they are presented, a sense of wonder which is the first step on the road to first philosophy (p. 138).

The fifth chapter is really a sort of appendix, having little to do with Aristotle's thoughts on religion. It was perhaps added to give the book a little more heft than it otherwise would have. In it, Segev briefly considers how Moses Maimonides and Albertus Magnus treat the quasi-mythical discourse in scripture in relation to philosophy. He shows that Maimonides believed that traditional Jewish religion can serve philosophy by directing the intellect to the sort of profound metaphysical questions surrounding the apprehension of God. But Maimonides does not do this, as Segev realizes, within the context of a political utopia. Albertus Magnus, like Maimonides, profoundly influenced by Aristotle, disagreed with both in privileging religious discourse over philosophy since the truths contained in scripture take precedence over the deliverances of unaided reason. Nevertheless, Albert agrees with both Maimonides and Aristotle on the desirability of a critical demythologizing of much that is contained in scripture.

In a concluding chapter, the author seeks to confront what he takes to be a tension between the many texts in Aristotle in which a "conservatism about traditional religion is shown" and those in which the theology on which that religion is based is uncompromisingly rejected (p. 167). Only here do we get Segev's concession that the claim that Aristotle thinks traditional religion is necessary to facilitate metaphysics is "conjectured based on the Politics" (p. 169). Segev quotes Aristotle's will in which devotion to traditional gods is manifest and then urges that this will is in harmony with Aristotle's rejection of the theology underlying civic religion. Perhaps. But what the will shows, if anything, is Aristotle's personal view, not his position as a law-giver for an ideal society.

It seems to me that Segev is too diffident about the distinction mentioned at the beginning of this review, namely, that between theology and civic religion. Aristotle was in line with his philosophical predecessors in submitting the theology of the poets to critical scrutiny. As for the practice of religion in poleis whether ideal or not, Segev does not make a plausible case for attributing to Aristotle anything more than a prudentially based positive assessment of the social cohesive effects of traditional religious practices. Many readers of this review will be able to appreciate what Segev evidently envisions as the possibility of a young person's involvement with traditional religion serving to inspire first doubt, then disbelief, and then a turn to a new philosophical path aimed at answering the questions that the traditional religion failed to answer satisfactorily. But there really is no evidence that this possibility is the reason why Aristotle assumed that an ideal polis would have something like a ministry of religious affairs.