Aristotle on Shame and Learning to Be Good

Aristotle On Shame And Learning To Be Good

Marta Jimenez, Aristotle on Shame and Learning to Be Good, Oxford University Press, 2020, 214 pp., $70.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198829683.

Reviewed by Howard J. Curzer, Texas Tech University


Marta Jimenez’s book is laser-focused on a single, crucial part of Aristotle’s account of the virtue-acquisition process, namely the learner’s development of appropriate motivation for the performance of virtuous acts. I shall sketch her claims and arguments chapter-by-chapter. To keep it spicy, I shall offer some challenges.

Chapter 0 Introduction

Aristotle says that character virtue is acquired by habituation (1103a14–18), and that virtuous people perform virtuous acts not only from good dispositions of action and passion, but also with the appropriate sort of knowledge, and the appropriate motivation (1105a31–33). Habituation can provide good habits of action and passion. Most commentators supplement Aristotle’s explicit statements by telling a story about how learners gain the relevant knowledge. But how, according to Aristotle, do learners come to be well-motivated? How do they come to choose acts for their own sake, or (equivalently, according to Jimenez) for the love of the noble (kalon)?

Jimenez’s solution has two parts. First, she maintains that in order for learners to become well-motivated via habituation there must be continuity between the motivation of learners and virtuous people (7–8). Learners do not come to love the noble ex nihilo, for habituation could not explain a switch from not-loving to loving the noble. They possess some initial tendency to love the noble which is then honed (12–13). Second, what enables learners to move smoothly from this initial tendency to the fully appropriate motivation is shame (aidōs, aischunē). Jimenez describes shame as a response to a failure (or potential failure) to live up to personal or social ideals that leads to the loss of self-esteem and the respect of others (3).

Shame is thought to be problematic in at least two ways. The heteronomy problem is that shame threatens to impede the learners’ autonomy because shame is a function of the opinions of others. Virtue requires that one make good choices, oneself, rather than meekly doing whatever is expected in order to avoid shame. The superficiality problem is that shame seems concerned with the reputation for virtue rather than the possession of virtue. Fear of disgrace is not love of nobility (4).

Jimenez argues for her claims about the benefits of shame in chapters 1, 2, and 6. She offers solutions to the problems confronting shame in chapters 4 and 6. In chapter 3, Jimenez describes a group of people (citizen soldiers) motivated by shame. In chapter 5, she raises and resolves a pair of puzzles in Aristotle’s account of shame.

Chapter 1

To acquire the disposition to act from the right motives via habituation, learners need to act with the right motives at least some of the time before they become virtuous. How is that possible if acting with the right motives is characteristic of the virtuous? Jimenez begins by calling attention to Aristotle’s response to a similar challenge with respect to action. Aristotle argues that habituation can work because not only the virtuous, but also learners can perform virtuous acts (1105a17–26). Most interpreters take Aristotle to be claiming that learners merely go through the motions. Learners know what they should do, and they do it, but not for the right reasons. Only the virtuous are rightly motivated. To argue against this interpretation, Jimenez turns to Aristotle’s comparison and contrast of the acquisition of skills and virtues. Aristotle says that to become either skillful or virtuous, learners must repeatedly perform the right acts well (1103b6–21) (26–27). Jimenez combines this passage with Aristotle’s description of what it takes to perform acts well. While making things skillfully requires merely performing the right acts, acting virtuously requires performing the right acts with knowledge and appropriate motivation (1105a31–3). Jimenez concludes that Aristotle’s answer to the challenge is that learners can choose right acts with the appropriate motivation. Not only is it possible for learners to perform virtuous acts, it is also possible for them to act with the right motive “at least occasionally and at least to some degree” (33).

Challenge: Jimenez maintains that the difference between learners and the virtuous is that learners act well only intermittently and partially. However, in 1105a31–33, Aristotle claims that acting well also includes acting with consistency and firmness. Thus, if Jimenez is going to rely on 1105a31–33 to claim that learners must share the motivation of the virtuous, then she must concede that they do not merely perform virtuous acts from the love of the noble occasionally and to some degree; they perform these acts from the love of the noble reliably and fully. But now there seems to be no difference between learners and the virtuous, and no role for shame. Indeed, Aristotle’s reason for distinguishing “acting in accord with virtue” and “acting virtuously” in 1105a17–26 is to insist that learners can do what the virtuous do without acting well, themselves.

Chapter 2

Does Aristotle maintain that we inculcate proper motivation by conditioning learners? Jimenez denies that Aristotelian learners come to love the noble through positive and/or negative reinforcement. Following Myles Burnyeat, Jimenez maintains that love of the noble is acquired through shame rather than through appetitive pleasure (contra Alasdair MacIntyre) or pain (contra Howard Curzer) (54–61). If learners began by performing virtuous acts for appetitive pleasure and ended by performing them for the love of the noble, then the switch in motivation would be another unexplained discontinuity in the virtue-acquisition process.

John Cooper and Sarah Broadie object that, according to Aristotle, learners cannot take pleasure in virtuous actions before acquiring the love of the noble (1099a8–9, 1117b29–30) (70–73). Jimenez defends Burnyeat’s account against their objections by appealing to her claim that people begin with a tendency to be motivated by the love of the noble. Learners are not yet reliably or fully well-motivated, but they can share in the pleasure of virtuous actions because they share in love of the noble (13–15, 73–74). Jimenez acknowledges that Aristotle seems to deny this in several passages (e.g., 1173b29–31), but she points out that Aristotle takes back his denial (1175a30–37) (74).

Challenge: Jimenez’s claim that, according to Aristotle, people begin with an innate tendency to be motivated by the noble is belied by Aristotle’s claim that nature provides only the morally neutral potential to become virtuous or vicious rather than a head start in the right direction. He says, “neither by nature nor contrary to nature do the virtues arise in us; rather we are adapted by nature to receive them and made perfect by habit” (1103a24–5).

Chapter 3

In NE III.8, Aristotle describes six sorts of pseudo-courage. People with these character traits generally perform right acts when confronting physical risk, but do not do so for the sake of the noble. Rather they are motivated by shame, fear, experience, spirit, hope, or ignorance. Chapter 3 consists of a detailed discussion of all six sorts of pseudo-courage. Of course, the sort of pseudo-courage most relevant to Jimenez’s inquiry is that of the citizen soldier who performs right acts motivated by shame. Her discussion of the other five sorts of pseudo-courage is interesting, but seems to be something of a digression.

Challenge: Perhaps Jimenez discusses the other five in order to show that people who merely act in accordance with virtue without appropriate motivation do not acquire virtue (113). If that is her aim, her discussion backfires. Aristotle does not say that people with the other sorts of pseudo-courage are on their way to acquiring virtue, but then he doesn’t say that citizen soldiers are on their way, either. If shame is the key to advancement, one might have expected Aristotle to say that citizen soldiers make progress while people with the other sorts of pseudo-courage do not.

Chapter 4

Chapter 4 provides Jimenez’s solution to the superficiality problem. She maintains that learners seek to avoid shame and acquire honor not solely for its own sake, but also for the sake of the noble. Moreover, they care not only that decent people respect their actions, but also that decent people consider these actions to be indicators of good character (122, 128–135). Jimenez supports this interpretation by noting that Aristotle’s examples of people diverted from bad actions by prospective shame are admirable Homeric heroes (Hector, Diomedes), and by appealing to Aristotle’s statement that, “people seem to pursue honor in order that they may be assured of their goodness . . .” (1095b26–28, also 1159a22–4).

Challenge: Homeric heroes arguably do seek to be honored for their actions, and desire honor for its own sake. After all, the Iliad begins with Achilles’s anger over receiving insufficient honor for his role in the preceding battle, and Achilles sees his participation in the war as a choice between glory for his deeds and long life (Iliad 9.497–504). Jimenez seems to be reading Aristotelian values anachronistically back into Homer. Furthermore, the people described in 1095b26–28 as pursuing honor in order to “be assured of their goodness” must be people who are already good (i.e., the virtuous) rather than those who are not yet good (i.e., learners).

Jimenez mentions another problem (or implication of the superficiality problem). Shame is tied to the values of one’s society, which may be regressive, so shame may inculcate bad values (120). Jimenez does not explicitly address this problem. Perhaps she is implicitly assuming that in the NE, Aristotle is talking to, and about learners who are fortunate enough to live in good societies.

Chapter 5

In IV.9 (1128b10–35) Aristotle badmouths shame while in X.9 (1179b4–16) he praises it. Aristotle seems to vacillate on whether shame is a good or bad thing (137). How should this apparent discrepancy be resolved? Some commentators take Aristotle to be switching between aidōs and aischunē. Others take him to be speaking about both prospective and retrospective shame in X.9, but only about retrospective shame in IV.9. Jimenez argues that Aristotle is not contradicting himself or equivocating, but rather is presenting two perspectives on shame. In IV.9, Aristotle is contrasting shame-motivated people with the virtuous, and in X.9 he is contrasting shame-motivated people with the cowardly and the intemperate. Shame-motivated people are neither virtuous nor vicious (139–148).

Aristotle says that emotions are not virtues because they are not (a) bases for character evaluation, (b) praiseworthy, (c) chosen, or (d) dispositions (1105b28–1106a6). Jimenez says that while shame is not sufficient for judging character, and is not chosen, it is sometimes described as praiseworthy, and sometimes as a disposition. She avoids accusing Aristotle of vacillating on shame’s status by describing shame as a praiseworthy emotional mean rather than as a virtue or emotion (154–158).

Challenge: Rather than postulating a kind of mental entity lying between emotion and virtue, one might explain Aristotle’s seeming vacillation by appealing to his remark that (a disposition to feel) shame is a virtue for learners, but not for those who are already virtuous. It is a role virtue for learners, but not a virtue, simpliciter (1128b15–23). Since shame has the characteristics of virtue when possessed by a learner, but not when possessed by an already-virtuous person, Aristotle gives the illusion of vacillation by switching between shame in learners and shame in the virtuous.

Chapter 6

In her introduction, Jimenez says that shame (e) causes learners to focus on how actions reveal character, (f) enables learners to listen to moral reasons by making them receptive to the opinions of others, and (g) turns learners away from the pleasant and the useful, and toward public recognition (i.e., honor, reputation, praise) (2, 12). These are plausible inferences from shame’s description, but they get the learner only to the point of desiring honor. Yet love of honor is not love of the noble.

In chapter 6, Jimenez painstakingly explains Aristotle’s accounts of shame in IV.9 and X.9, sentence by sentence. From X.9, she extracts the claim that by avoiding the shameful, shame-motivated learners come to (h) love the noble, (i) know what things are noble, and (j) experience noble pleasures (171–176). Thus, Jimenez arrives at the conclusion that shame grows learners’ initial warm, fuzzy feelings toward the noble into full-fledged, appropriate motivation.

Challenge: Although Aristotle says that shame-motivated learners love, know, and enjoy the noble, he does not say that it is shame that inculcates these things. For all Aristotle says, full-fledged love of the noble might be a precondition of shame, accomplished by some other mechanism. Indeed, Aristotle indicates elsewhere that music inculcates not only good passions, but also “enjoying decent characters and noble actions” (Politics 1340a17–18). Learners come to be motivated by love of the noble through music. Jimenez allows that music supplements shame (14). But music alone might do the trick, leaving shame free to play a different role in the virtue-acquisition process such as building habits of good action by disincentivizing shameful acts.

At the end of chapter 6, Jimenez offers a solution to the heteronomy problem. Aristotle says that shame lies in a mean between shamelessness (caring for the opinions of no one) and timidity (caring for the opinions of everyone, including those with poor judgment or values). Learners possessing the proto-virtue of shame care about the opinions of decent people (EE 1233b26–29). Thus, shame-motivated learners exercise their autonomy by making their own choices about whose opinions to value (182–184).

Challenge: Jimenz’s claim that shame-motivated learners exercise their autonomy contradicts her assertion in chapter 5 that shame does not involve choice. Moreover, although choosing someone to follow is an exercise of autonomy, it is only one choice. Learners who make no further choices on their own are unlikely to become sufficiently autonomous.

Bottom line

Jimenez expresses herself clearly, and with mastery of both Aristotle’s text and the secondary literature. She provides frequent reminders of her previous points as she goes along, and signposts of what is to come in each chapter. Her interpretive claims are non-trivial and eminently plausible. Hopefully, my challenges have given some indication of how very thought-provoking Jimenez’s book is. Jimenez has provided an extremely thorough, well-argued, persuasive, engaging treatment of Aristotle’s view of shame’s role in the virtue-acquisition process. Her book is indispensable for anyone interested in this topic.


Sarah Broadie, Ethics with Aristotle, New York: Oxford University Press, 1991.

Myles Burnyeat, “Aristotle on Learning to be Good.” Essays on Aristotle’s Ethics, ed. Amélie Rorty, Berkeley: University of California Press, 1980.

John Cooper, “Reason, Moral Virtue, and Moral Value,” Rationality in Greek Thought, eds. Michael Frede and Gisela Striker, Oxford University Press, 1996, 81–114.

Howard Curzer, “Aristotle’s Painful Path to Virtue,” Journal of the History of Philosophy, 40 (2002), 141–162.

Alasdair MacIntyre, After Virtue, Notre Dame: University of Notre Dame Press, 1981.