Aristotle on Teleology

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Monte Ransome Johnson, Aristotle on Teleology, Oxford University Press, 2005, 339pp, $74.00 (hbk), ISBN 0199285306.

Reviewed by T.K. Johansen, University of Edinburgh


Teleology pervades Aristotle's philosophy, perhaps like no other notion. Its applications range from elemental theory and chemistry, to psychology, biology, astronomy, ethics and politics. Surveying the uses of teleology throughout his philosophy can thus serve as a good introduction to Aristotle's overall philosophy. Monte Ransome Johnson's study provides such a survey, and in the process gives us an in-depth analysis of Aristotelian teleology, its nature and its limitations.

Johnson's own general view of Aristotle's teleology is this: 'Aristotle thinks that the fact that things function well in nature needs a general explanation. But the explanations he offers invariably make reference to specific natural substances. He is wary of attempts to generalize about a generic, overall good, which he holds has little or no explanatory power … His teleological explanations in the works on nature make reference to the good of specific kinds of things -- stars, elements, plants, animals, humans, families, and cities -- and not just to human beings, god, or some other overarching cosmic good' (11). Accordingly, much of the book is devoted to clearing away what Johnson takes to be misunderstandings of Aristotelian teleology. So Aristotle's teleology of living creatures is 'not anthropomorphic, not committed to backwards causation, and not a mere heuristic for materialist and mechanistic explanations' (188). On these points I think Johnson is entirely successful. However, Johnson also wants to show that Aristotle's teleology is neither anthropocentric nor cosmic, and on these points I shall suggest some ways in which his arguments may be challenged.

The work falls in two parts. The first, 'Teleology as a Critical Explanatory Framework', contains an excellent historical survey of the interpretations of Aristotle's teleology -- I found the demonstration of Kant's influence on Aristotelian scholarship particularly valuable -- an outline of the theory of the four causes, the final cause in particular, and an account of the dialectic between Aristotle's teleology and the explanatory theories of Aristotle's predecessors and contemporaries.

The discussion in this part cruises along nicely until it hits choppy waters in the final section on Plato. The problem arises from Johnson's defence of Aristotle's claim in Metaphysics I.6 that Plato only used the formal and the material causes, and so not the final cause. Aristotle's claim seems to fly in the face of passages in the Phaedo, Philebus, Laws and Timaeus, where Plato indicates how one might or should explain something by reference to its end. Johnson's explanation of why Aristotle is nonetheless right about Plato is this:

It is because of Plato's prioritization of art over nature, and his specification of the cause for the sake of which with reference to the whole universe, and not with reference to its individuals or natural kinds, means that he did not employ the notion of the for the sake of which as a cause -- i.e. in a causal explanation. He specifies no end for the technology, nor indicates a real beneficiary. (127)

It is worth dwelling a little on some problems with this explanation since it helps bring out some distinctive features of Johnson's understanding of teleology. First of all, it cannot be right, even for Aristotle, to say that if one explains the cosmos as the creation of art then one cannot also explain it as created for the sake of something. One might think that Aristotle's use of what Johnson calls the 'art model' in texts such as Physics II.8 199a8-20 is exactly meant to show how nature displays final causation even more than art, an argument that works only because it is already accepted that art does work for the sake of an end. Johnson counters by distinguishing a model which provides a 'heuristic' for thinking about causality from a 'theoretical discussion' of causality. According to Johnson, Plato provides the former but not the latter. So when Plato talks about how things are created by art for an end, he is not really providing a teleological explanation. Similarly, when Aristotle uses the art model he

does not intend [the art model] to explain anything, but merely to give us a notion of how causality itself works on the basis of the facts most readily available to ourselves (i.e. how intentional agency and the crafts can produce definite results.) (126)

Johnson here seems to suggest that the reason why Aristotle thinks that Plato did not use the final cause is not that he did not try to account for how things come about with reference to their ends, but that these accounts were not grounded in a proper theory of causes, of the sort that only Aristotle provides. This is indeed raising the bar high for what should count as a teleological explanation: notice here that Aristotle's complaint in Metaphysics I.6 was not about having a theory of final causes but about using final causes. But perhaps Johnson's next point in the quotation is more telling: Plato seems to say, in texts such as Laws X, that it is part of the conception of the universe as an artifact that its parts exist for the sake of the whole, and so that the good of the parts is relative to the good of the whole. Aristotle, on the other hand, believes, according to Johnson, that there is no 'cosmic good' but only the good for individual species of being. Again one can query whether Johnson has presented Plato correctly. Already in the Phaedo Socrates requested that an account should state both the best for each individual and the common good for all, in that order (98b). In the Timaeus, meanwhile, it is clear that Timaeus does aim to create a cosmos that is, as a whole, as good as possible, but he also works out what is good for each individual species with reference to their needs, that is to say, not simply in terms of what is the good of the cosmos as a whole. So, to mention one of many examples, the human gut is shaped the way it is to delay the passage of food and thus leave us time for higher activities than eating (73a). However, even if Johnson were right and Plato somehow thought of the good of the individual only in terms of the good of the whole, it would still not follow that Plato's account was any less teleological, unless one already had some reason to think that a teleological account could only properly refer to the good of individual species. Perhaps the final line of the quotation is supposed to indicate that the cosmos as a whole could not qualify as a beneficiary of the creation. One might think so because whilst individual species of living beings clearly have interests in their own survival and well-being, that could not be said of the cosmos as a whole since the cosmos, as a whole, is not a living being. That again may be correct on Aristotle's view of the cosmos, but clearly not for Plato, who in the Timaeus, takes the cosmos itself to be an animal, indeed, the animal which contains all others as its parts (30b-d).

In the second part, 'Teleological Explanations in Natural Science', Johnson explores Aristotle's use of teleology in accounting for, in ascending order, the simple bodies, organisms, man, human society, and the cosmos as a whole. The overall picture amply supports Johnson's conclusion that 'Aristotle's teleology is most successful on the level of the explanation of organism' (287).

At the level of the elements, Johnson convincingly shows their movements to be an expression of final causation, without thereby involving any quasi-intentional impulses. The account of teleological changes of the elements also gives Johnson the opportunity to address the dispute about the teleology of rainfall. In Physics II.8 Aristotle wants to argue that nature also works for an end, but then raises an aporia: 'What prevents nature creating neither for the sake of something, nor because it is better, but as Zeus rains, not in order to make crops grow, but out of necessity?' (198b16-19). The aporia seems to assume that rainfall does not serve an end, and Johnson takes Aristotle to share this assumption: rainfall is a result of absolute necessity; it is regular, depending on the seasons, but it is not therefore itself for the sake of anything. However, the assumption seems undermined by Aristotle's resolution of the aporia: 'these and all natural things come about as they do either always or for the most part, but what is by luck and by spontaneity does not. For it does not seem to be by luck or coincidence that it rains frequently in the winter, but only when it does so in the summer' (198b34-199a2) It seems quite clear that winter rainfall is for the sake of something, otherwise there would be no contrast with the infrequent summer rainfall. So what is winter rainfall for? David Sedley has argued that it is for the sake of man's growing crops. So read, the passage supports anthropocentric cosmic teleology. Johnson objects that rainfall serves to make the crops grow only because we humans have the art of agriculture, by which we can use the rain to grow plants. However, in at least two ways Johnson's argument against Sedley falls short. Firstly, since, as Johnson points out elsewhere (81, cf. Physics 199a15-16), Aristotle takes art in many cases as perfecting nature, it is reasonable to understand agriculture as helping complete an end that is latent in natural things, an end which may well, then, be thought of as anthropocentric. Secondly, Johnson describes the anthropocentric interpretation as if it required that the explanandum be explained only in terms of human ends. So he says that 'rainfall could only be for the sake of humans in a strong sense (i.e. not just incidentally beneficial) if it fell just because it was necessary for human survival. If it falls for the sake of something else, or due to absolutely necessary factors, then its benefit to humans is incidental to its real causes and hence to its explanation.' (153-4, my emphasis). Here I missed a recognition of Sedley's use of Aristotle's distinction between two notions of 'that for the sake of which', as the aim (to hou) and as the beneficiary (to hôi), a distinction whose importance Johnson notes elsewhere (65). Sedley explicitly claimed in his article (Phronesis 1991: 180) that rainfall ultimately (mark) happens for the sake of man as the beneficiary. It is clear from elsewhere (e.g. DA II.4) that Aristotle thinks that the same phenomenon can have a final cause in both senses. So, the beneficiary of rainfall need not be incidental to the causation of rainfall, even if rainfall also happens to have an aim that is distinct from man.

Even if we agree with Johnson in rejecting anthropocentric teleology, we may of course still espouse cosmic teleology. Aristotle clearly believes that the cosmos as a whole displays order. However, on Johnson's interpretation this order seems an accidental result of the way in which the individual species pursue their individual goods. The individual species do not in any way pursue their ends so that the overall cosmic order will come to be. It could of course be that Aristotle thinks that there is no principle responsible for ordering the cosmos as a whole. But the key passage in Metaphysics L 10 certainly suggests the opposite:

We must also consider in which way the nature of the whole possesses the good and the best, whether as something separated and itself by itself, or as its order. Or is it both ways, like an army? For the good is both in the order and the general, and more so in the general. For he is not due to the order, but the order is due to him. And all things are somehow jointly ordered, but not in the same way, for both fishes and birds, and plants. And it is not such that one thing has no relationship to another; but there is some relationship. For all things are jointly ordered (suntetaktai) with respect to one thing (pros hen). But it is as in a household, where the free have least licence to act as they chance to, but all or most of what they do is arranged, while the slaves and beasts can do a little towards what is communal, but act mostly as they chance to. For that is the kind of principle that nature is of each of them. (1075a11-23, Johnson's translation based on Sedley)

First of all, Johnson is sceptical about whether this passage is concerned with teleology at all. He suggests (279) that Aristotle by 'with respect to one thing (pros hen)' has in mind something like 'focal meaning', that is, a semantic rather than a causal relationship. However, this seems to underestimate the force of 'with respect to one thing' together with 'ordered'. Secondly, Johnson maintains (272) that even in this passage Aristotle is concerned to rule out notions of good other than that specific to individual species. There is no good for all beings in the cosmos, whether we take this to mean a) a good represented by a distinct being such as god, or b) a good represented by the cosmos as a whole over and above the good for each individual species as such. Johnson seems (274) to take it as sufficient to dispel a) to say, on the basis of Eudemian Ethics I.8, that there can be no good in the sciences beyond what is practicable for human beings. The highest such good is 'intelligence' (nous), as practiced by god with no implication that this good exists as a 'good-itself'. One senses an ignoratio elenchi here: to say that one can identify the highest good as intelligence in ethics without identifying it as a separate good says nothing about whether Aristotle in Metaphysics L should want to make the highest good exist separately. As far as b), Johnson views the army comparison as 'very limited in explanatory potential, unless it shows that Aristotle wants to stress that the good is not separate from the individual things that are good, but is rather an immanent principle that accounts for the organization of the many things that are good' (275). Of course it is right to say that if the good lies in the order then the good is immanent in the members of the order in so far as the good is not present in something outside of the order. However, this still seems significantly different from the message which Johnson wants to extract from the passage, namely that the good is immanent in the members of the order by their nature as the sort of individuals they are (276). Rather, if the good is in the order, we naturally think that the members, by realising their good, are realising a good that does not just pertain to them as the individuals they are but as members of that order. For a parallel, we may think here of Aristotle's notion of man as politikon zoon, where man realises his own good by realising the common good of the city. However, Johnson also finds the household analogy in the quoted passage unhelpful: it is 'not a happy basis on which to build a theory about how the good exists in the universe' (277). This dismissal follows his previous argument for 'the need for extreme caution [when reading the Politics] in extending the whole-part analysis beyond organic substances to relations between organisms such as obtain in the household' (277). On Johnson's reading, Metaphysics L 10 seems to be a singularly unsuccessful piece of philosophical writing by Aristotle.

As should be clear by now, I wasn't greatly moved by Johnson's criticisms of anthropocentric and cosmic teleology. However, great stretches of this book are clear, persuasive, and well-documented. Johnson is, then, to be congratulated on having written a comprehensive and stimulating study on an important topic. Anybody interested in teleology will want to read and probe the arguments of this book.