Aristotle on the Common Sense

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Pavel Gregoric, Aristotle on the Common Sense, Oxford UP, 2007, 252pp., $75.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199277377.

Reviewed by Christopher Shields, University of Oxford



The common sense under investigation in this dissertation-descended monograph is not that commodity cherished by philosophers of the Scottish Enlightenment but derided by Kant as the conceit by which ‘the stalest windbag can confidently take up with the soundest thinker.’1 It is rather that faculty or facility by which we manage to engage in various forms of cross-modal and higher-order perceptual activity. More precisely, the ‘common sense’ investigated by Gregoric centers on the fistful of instances in which Aristotle uses the phrase koinê aisthêsis (common sense, or, better, common perception). In view of its narrowly circumscribed focus, Aristotle on the Common Sense will be read only by specialist Aristotelians, and among them primarily only those interested in Aristotle’s account of aisthêsis (perception). For this reason, and because Gregoric makes only very brief and begrudging allusions to contemporary work in the philosophy of perception (e.g., 212), I will restrict my assessment to the contribution made by this monograph to the scholarly literature on Aristotle’s theory of perception.

Aristotle on the Common Sense comprises three sections: (i) ‘The Framework’ (1-51), in which Gregoric recapitulates in a schematic way Aristotle’s general approach to perception; (ii) ‘The Terminology’ (52-125), in which he argues that Aristotle mentions koinê aisthêsis not three times, as most other exegetes have supposed, but rather altogether five times across his corpus; and (iii) ‘Functions of the Common Sense’ (129-201), in which he investigates precisely what it is that Aristotle supposes koinê aisthêsis to do. In addition, Gregoric supplies an introduction, reviewing the Platonic background to his topic; a general conclusion, which recapitulates the book’s main contentions; an appendix of six brief Greek texts, four drawn from Aristotle’s De Anima, and one each from De Memoria et Reminiscentia and De Sensu et Sensibilibus; a bibliography; an index of passages cited; and a general index. The book is well-produced, with only occasional lapses in the type-setting of Greek.

There is a large and established journal literature on the topic of koinê aisthêsis in Aristotle. This is in one way surprising, since he barely mentions the topic at all. Still, it is in another way understandable that scholars should be keen to tease out Aristotle’s probable philosophical motivations for introducing any such mental faculty. One strength of Gregoric’s book lies in the clear and workmanlike way in which he compiles the views of the many other scholars who have treated his topic. As he notes, if one surveys the various treatments of such scholars as Ross, Block, Kahn, and Sorabji, we find a very broad range of proposals regarding the nature and function of koinê aisthêsis (12-15).

These scholars suspect Aristotle of having postulated koinê aisthêsis in order to account for various abilities we manifest in the realm of perception, including inter alia: our ability to perceive common sensibles, such as motion and shape, which are peculiar to no one sensory modality; our ability to perceive that we perceive, an ability that is itself variously characterized as second-order perception of first-order perceptual states or as simple perceptual awareness; our ability to perceive time; our ability to remember what we perceive; and our ability to perceive distinct qualities by different sensory modalities as belonging to the same object, as, for instance, when we perceive that the red thing is damask-scented. As Deborah Modrak fairly observes, unless we can find some underlying uniformity to these various functions, “then Aristotle’s conception of the common sense seems ad hoc at best and arbitrary at worst.”2

Confronted with this sort of worry, Gregoric’s way forward is to ask and answer two questions: "First, what does Aristotle himself designate with the phrase ‘common sense’? Second, what should we designate as the Aristotelian notion of the common sense?" (203)

In addressing his first question, which also sets the framework for his approach to the second, Gregoric answers that Aristotle refers to three different things by the phrase ‘common sense’:

We can conclude, then, that Aristotle has three different uses of the phrase ‘common sense’, for he designates three quite different types of things with that phrase. This is a conclusion whose importance for our subject can hardly be exaggerated (204).

These are, according to Gregoric: the individual senses, common sensibility to particular features, and what he calls the sensory capacity of the soul, which he takes to be something distinct from the perceptual faculty of the soul.

As for the second question, Gregoric seeks to winnow down the unwieldy list of functions scholars have ascribed to koinê aisthêsis to just four: “I have identified four distinct functions of the common sense: (1) simultaneous perception, (2) perceptual discrimination, (3) control of the senses, and (4) monitoring of the senses” (207).

Gregoric arrives at these conclusions principally by relying upon three revisionary contentions. First, he seeks to show that scholars have, to their own detriment, neglected certain key passages concerning koinê aisthêsis; these passages, according to Gregoric, contain important and overlooked data capable of correcting the misapprehensions of other exegetes. Second, he introduces a striking account of the unity and division of Aristotelian soul. The soul, he maintains, is a unity divided only into what he calls ‘conceptual parts’ (24-27, 52, 213). The third contention concerns just which parts those might be; it is in this third contention that Gregoric introduces the most surprising novelty of his monograph, that Aristotle recognizes a faculty of the soul which has hitherto gone unnoticed, what Gregoric calls the sensory faculty, in distinction from the perceptual faculty.

With respect to each of these three topics, Gregoric offers highly controversial interpretations of Aristotle. Because these are the areas in which Gregoric attempts to move beyond the already considerable journal literature on this topic, I focus upon them exclusively in what follows.

(1) In the second section of his monograph, ‘The Terminology’, Gregoric investigates the number of passages in which Aristotle treats the topic of koinê aisthêsis. Traditionally, scholars have limited their attention to three indisputable occurrences: De anima iii 1, 425a27, De Memoria et Reminiscentia 1 450a10, and Parts of Animals iv 10, 686a31, though some also find a truncated reference at De Anima iii 7 431b5. Gregoric seeks to expand his canon by augmenting it with two additional passages: History of Animals I 3 489a17 and Metaphysics i 1, 981b14. “To my knowledge,” he says, “these two occurrences have never been treated, or even mentioned, by any scholar dealing with, or only touching upon, Aristotle’s notion of the common sense” (66).

The reason that no scholar dealing with koinê aisthêsis has treated these passages in that connection is that neither deals with the faculty or facility that Aristotle calls koinê aisthêsis. In History of Animals I 3 489a17, Aristotle says: ‘Only one sense is common to all animals, touch (pasi de tois zô(i)ois aisthêsis mia huparchei koinê monê, hê haphê). This is neither more nor less than it seems to be, namely the suggestion that touch is the most common sensory faculty; no animal lacks it, although many animals lack one or more of the other senses (cf. EN iii 10 1118b1; De Anima ii 2, 413b4-9, iii 12 434b11-18). To say that this is an implicit way of referring to the koinê aisthêsis is rather like — to revert to Kant’s sense of the phrase for a moment — saying that since the senses are common to all animals, all animals have common sense. It is not that scholars have somehow missed Gregoric’s neglected passages; it is that they have rightly seen that they have no bearing on the question of the nature of the koinê aisthêsis. Similar considerations apply to Metaphysics i 1, 981b14.

Perhaps not much would turn on this were it not for the fact that Gregoric seeks to draw striking conclusions from his extension, including that “in the overlooked occurrences the phrase ‘common sense’ refers to the individual senses” and that in these same overlooked passages, “the phrase ‘common sense’ is not a proper name for any particular perceptual capacity, but rather a description of the individual senses in certain contexts” (68). In point of fact, however, the phrase ‘common sense’ (koinê aisthêsis) does not occur in either of the passages Gregoric represents as unduly neglected.

(2) With respect to his second main innovation, Gregoric is keen to maintain that the faculties of the soul are mere ‘conceptual parts’, or, as he also calls them, ‘logical parts’ or ‘aspects’ (24, 38-39). This claim seems to me exactly right — if it is interpreted correctly. The proviso is necessary because Gregoric never makes clear what it means for a part to be conceptual. He mainly proceeds by way of contrast: conceptual parts are not spatial parts, are not aggregative parts, and are not the kind of parts in which the soul could be divided (26-27). Elsewhere, however, he falls into calling the soul a ‘set’ of capacities, where, if his language is not loose, he means that the soul’s capacities stand to the soul as elements to a set (19, 34, 67). In that case, however, the soul is itself an extensional entity such that its capacities and its elements can indeed exist without it. Presumably, given the tenor of his contrasts between conceptual and non-conceptual parts elsewhere, he does not mean to embrace any such consequence. The question thus re-arises: what is it for the soul’s parts to be conceptual or logical parts?

Eventually, Gregoric glosses his contention in broadly pragmatic terms. Aristotle’s commitment to a conceptual division of the soul “enables him to divide the soul along different joints, and thus, to account for other, more complex, activities of animals” (52). When the soul is “conceptually redivided for such purposes, new and previous unmentioned capacities of the soul emerge” (52). This suggests, then, that the divisions of the soul are explanation-relative, so that for any given phenomenon needing an explanation, we may postulate a soul-part. Thus, while a plant’s tropism for light is to be explained by its nutritive soul, its threptikon, Alcibiades’ complex erotic conduct may be explained by his erotic faculty, his erôtikon. Or we may say again that Alcibiades’ treachery flows from his sedition faculty, his proclivity to brag from his vanity faculty, and so on. It is unclear whether Gregoric will want to accept such consequences on Aristotle’s behalf. Perhaps if being a conceptual part of the soul is merely being one of its ‘aspects’, then the soul will have as many parts as it has aspects, and the number of soul-parts will be unconstrained. Yet this is precisely a result of soul division that Aristotle is keen to reject (De Anima 432a22-b6).

(3) These worries about the status of conceptual parts are consequential in that they also bear on Gregoric’s final and most controversial departure from orthodoxy. He contends that Aristotle recognizes as two distinct psychic capacities a sensory faculty and a perceptual faculty, whereas it is customary to understand him as recognizing only one perceptual faculty, which he calls, using perfectly standard language, the aisthêtikon. Still, in principle, nothing prohibits his marking two distinct capacities by means of a single term — especially if those capacities are distinct in a sufficiently relaxed sense of ‘conceptual distinction’.

As Gregoric presents the matter, the sensory soul has two ‘constituent parts’, namely, the perceptual faculty and imagination (54). The latter two faculties Aristotle is at pains to distinguish in De Anima iii 3 (4285-16, 428b10-429a2). If they are distinct faculties they may yet, of course, jointly constitute some higher faculty, just as we may say that the five senses are distinct faculties jointly constituting our general perceptual faculty. (I would not, myself, however, wish to say that the power of sight was merely conceptually distinct from, e.g., the power to smell, but we may set that aside.)

Typically, Aristotle individuates capacities by their objects (De Anima ii 4, 415a20-21): sight is that faculty able to detect colours, while smell is the faculty able to detect scents. At a higher level of generality, then, the perceptual faculty (aisthêtikon) is distinguished from the intellectual faculty (noêtikon) because it ranges over perceptibles and not intelligibles. So, following this practice, if Aristotle wants to distinguish between the sensory and perceptual faculties, in the manner Gregoric contends, then we might expect him to distinguish between different levels of objects: sense objects and perceptual objects. Yet Aristotle shows no sign of doing so, nor does Gregoric suppose that he does.

Instead, he tries to locate this distinction in a single clause of a single sentence of On Sleep 1, which states that sleeping and waking are "both affections related to perception of the primary perceptual capacity" (Gregoric’s translation and italics: amphô gar esti ta pathê tauta peri aisthêsin tou prôtou aisthêtikou; DSV 454a22-24). His one-sentence argument is, however, well wide of its mark. It is also astonishingly brief, given the major role Gregoric’s postulation of a new sensory faculty plays in his interpretation of Aristotle. His argument:

Unless the primary perceptual capacity was also in charge of something other than perception, notably of imagination which is active during sleep, it would be rather difficult to explain the qualification ‘related to perception’ in this sentence (55).

Yet Aristotle’s reference to aisthêsis in this sentence is not a qualification at all, and the point of his reference is made clear by a word for some reason omitted in Gregoric’s translation, namely since (gar). Aristotle is arguing in this passage that no animal is ever perpetually awake or perpetually asleep. To set the stage, he appeals to his normal distinction between nutritive and perceptual souls by way of observing that beings with nutritive souls, plants, do not sleep. So, he infers, sleeping and waking are affections (pathê) belonging to beings endowed with perception, that is, to animals. Accordingly, he contends, a necessary condition of sleeping or waking at all is having perception, "since these are both affections which concern perception of the primary perceptual faculty." I take it, as I surmise Gregoric does as well, that the phrase tou prôtou aisthêtikou is not an objective genitive. Aristotle’s point, put periphrastically, is just that nothing is ever always asleep or awake, because a necessary condition of being in either condition is having a faculty of perception — since both being asleep and being awake pertain to perception, which is an activity belonging to the primary perceptual faculty. As Aristotle goes on to insist, the organs have natural functions, and so tire when they are overused. Consequently, animals need to sleep. That concludes the first half of Aristotle’s argument. He then turns to the second half in the passage immediately following, by arguing on teleological grounds that no animal is always asleep either.

Nowhere in all this does Aristotle state or suggest that there is a sensory faculty distinct from the perceptual faculty, the aisthêtikon, which he systematically recognizes across his psychological writings.3 Moreover, nowhere in this chapter does Aristotle even mention imagination (phantasia), the faculty imported by Gregoric to complement the perceptual faculty as a co-constituent of the postulated higher faculty, the sensory faculty. It is therefore difficult to see why he regards himself as licensed to ascribe any such distinction to Aristotle. Aristotle in fact makes no such distinction, and postulates no such higher order faculty. This is unfortunate for the development of Gregoric’s overarching argument, since he appeals to his distinction over and over again in his ensuing discussions of koinê aisthêsis, even to the point of claiming that koinê aisthêsis is “the proper name for the sensory capacity of the soul which comprises the perceptual and the imaginative capacity of the soul” (91, 97, 108, 200, 205, 213; 124). If so, koinê aisthêsis is a proper name with vacuous reference.

Indeed, matters become a bit vexing when one considers the intersection of Gregoric’s two primary novelties: (i) that the Aristotelian soul is divided only into conceptual parts, and (ii) that numbered among these parts is a faculty unknown to Aristotle’s other exegetes. We are told that conceptual parts are ‘aspects’, and that the perceptual faculty is a conceptual part of the sensory soul. So, the perceptual faculty of the soul is an aspect of the sensory faculty of the soul. Yet this sensory faculty of the soul is identified with koinê aisthêsis (koinê aisthêsis is “the proper name for the sensory capacity”; 124, cf. 213). It follows, then, that the perceptual faculty is an aspect or conceptual part of koinê aisthêsis. Yet, in the midst of a cursory attempt to refute a subtle, sophisticated, and textually nuanced discussion of higher-order awareness in Aristotle by Victor Caston,4 Gregoric speaks of “the other aspect of the perceptual capacity of the soul (the common sense)” (189). This makes koinê aisthêsis but one aspect of the perceptual capacity of the soul, which is itself but one aspect of the sensory capacity of the soul. As we have just seen, however, the sensory capacity (according to Gregoric) is the same as koinê aisthêsis. So, the sensory capacity is a part of one of its parts. At this point it becomes exceedingly difficult to keep the picture of Aristotle presented by Gregoric in any kind of focus.

For these reasons, Aristotelian scholars will be unlikely to adopt Gregoric’s more striking innovations regarding koine aisthêsis. Indeed, and perhaps inevitably, scholars will find a great deal to disagree with in this monograph. In this review, I have highlighted some of Gregoric’s more tendentious and adventurous exegetical findings, and have suggested that in these respects he does not much advance our understanding of his narrowly circumscribed topic. Still, and to conclude on a more positive note, this monograph may be commended for its enterprising engagement with a topic rightly identified by its author as the fountainhead of a long, complex, and demanding series of issues pertaining to our mental architecture and economy.

1 Kant, Immanuel, Prolegomena to Any Future Metaphysic trans. L.W. Beck (New York: 1951), 259.

2 Modrak, Deborah, Aristotle: The Power of Perception (University of Chicago Press: 1987), 62.

3 To this one may add that Aristotle uses the phrase prôton aisthêtikon only four other times, and in none of these instances does he give any indication that he means to distinguish a sensory faculty from a perceptual faculty (DM 450a11, a11, a14, Part. An. 666 a34-35). On the contrary, in the last of these passages he is arguing in a physiological mode that the heart is the prôton aisthêtikon, the primary faculty of sensation (cf. Part. An. 666a17).

4 Caston, Victor, ‘Aristotle on Consciousness,’ Mind 111 (2002), 751-815. Caston’s contentions are more fully scrutinized in Sisko, John, ‘Reflexive Awareness Does Belong to the Main Function of Perception: Reply to Victor Caston,’ Mind 113 (2004), 513-21.