Aristotle on the Uses of Contemplation

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Matthew D. Walker, Aristotle on the Uses of Contemplation, Cambridge University Press, 2018, 261pp., $99.99 (hbk), ISBN 9781108421102.

Reviewed by Tom Angier, University of Cape Town


This is an important book. It represents a key challenge to the view that Aristotle's ethics can adequately be understood apart from its biological and wider metaphysical background. In particular, it challenges the widespread view -- widespread at least in the Anglophone world -- that Aristotle is not a theist, or (more modestly) that his theism does not significantly inform his ethical theory. This strangely persistent myth is propounded by Anthony Kenny, for example, who holds that that theory rests on 'totally secular assumptions' (Kenny 1992, 11), and Michael Tkacz, who asserts that it is exclusively 'naturalistic' in content (Tkacz 2012, 68).[1] In this rigorous, highly detailed and elegantly written monograph, Matthew Walker demonstrates the untenability of this myth, while simultaneously demonstrating how Aristotle's theism is deeply implicated in his metaphysical biology. Although I have quarrels with aspects of his account, overall it constitutes a major contribution to the scholarly literature -- not least in its deployment of the Protrepticus -- and deserves to reshape fundamentally our approach to Aristotle's ethics.

In chapter one, Walker begins by outlining the 'utility question', viz. the puzzle of how to reconcile two claims, namely: (i) that contemplation or theôria is 'the main organising principle in our kind-specific good as human beings', and (ii), that theôria appears divorced from lower (self-maintaining) functions, and is hence 'thoroughly useless' (1). Walker papers over an ambiguity here in the notion of being 'useless', since while contemplation is evidently useless in the (strict) sense of not subserving any higher functions, it is not so in the (looser) sense of being valueless. Indeed, Aristotle presents contemplation as conditioning primary eudaimonia or fulfilment, the most consummate form of value there is. Nonetheless, Walker's point is that this conception of value is oddly discontinuous with other key Aristotelian commitments: notably, the commitment that nature does nothing in vain, and thus could not provide animals with an authoritative function that is wholly irrelevant to their biological and practical self-maintenance. (Perception is an authoritative function in nonhuman animals, but also helps them find food, drink, etc.) This problem is compounded if theôria is not only irrelevant to, but also tends to distract from and undermine human self-maintenance -- as it may well do, if we accord it the kind of superlative (divine) value Aristotle hints at in Nicomachean Ethics [NE] I and affirms in NE X. In this way, Walker sets up the governing problematic of his book, to which his response will be 'broadly naturalistic': he will argue, in other words, contra the extant scholarly consensus, that contemplation of the eternal and divine is useful for our biological and practical functioning, and is therefore 'continuous with [Aristotle's] account of the good for plants and nonhuman animals' (3).

Chapter two tackles the thorny issue of how contemplation relates to eudaimonia. Does it exhaust the latter (exclusivism)? Or does it constitute merely one element of the eudaimôn life (inclusivism)? Walker argues that contemplation is the dominant end within an inclusive array of eudaimonic ends. Where he is original is in arguing, further, for an 'accordance-inclusivist reading' (21): not only is contemplation the dominant end within eudaimonia, it also directs our other life-activities, so that they accord with it (19). In support of this reading, he appeals to Aristotle's claim that the human function is 'activity of soul according to (kata) reason or not without reason' (NE 1098a7-8). In this context, Walker maintains, kata does not restrict the human function to the exercise of reason or logos, but rather casts logos as that which directs our functioning. And he cites other uses of kata to back this up: e.g. virtue as kata tēn phronēsin at 1144b23-5 (virtue does not instantiate phronēsis, but accords with it). This is an ingenious reading, and may carry weight -- though it does blunt the contrast between being kata and being 'not without' (mē aneu) reason. Suffice it to say, it forms the first key plank in Walker's wider, constructive argument: viz. that theôria governs human functioning as a whole, rather than being confined to a narrow, leisured, elite activity. As section 2.4 makes clear, moreover, it is fitted to play this holistic role, since its objects are not inert or merely speculative. On the contrary: they embody the 'divine first principles' of the cosmic order (27), thus demonstrating 'the good for the sake of which the whole of nature exists' (28). In this way, Walker points to the essentially theological content of theôria, content which endows it with deep practical relevance.

Chapter three rehearses Aristotle's 'nested hierarchy of life-functions' (46), and concentrates on its lowest, 'threptic' (i.e. nutritive and reproductive) aspect. All organisms require this, from plants to humans, since it constitutes their most basic 'power for self-maintenance' (51), ensuring against the tendency of matter to disintegrate. While this is clear vis-à-vis nutrition (which regenerates the organism), it holds also with regard to reproduction (which generates another organism), thereby enabling the individual organism to both participate in and approximate immortality. As Aristotle puts things at De Anima 415b6-7, through reproduction an organism 'remains not itself, but such as itself, not one in number, but one in species'. In this nod to the Symposium's doctrine of quasi-immortalisation, Walker indicates both how his Aristotle is strongly continuous with Plato (cf. 8-9), and how, even at the most basic level of functioning, living things are teleologically related to the divine.

Chapter four moves beyond the threptikon as such to the perceptive power or aisthētikon. On the one hand, nutrition is for the sake of perception and subserves it (57); on the other, perception is useful for nutrition and guides it (59), since without perception animals would be unable to seek sustenance. This raises a puzzle: if nutrition and perception are reciprocal powers, why hold that the relation of teleological subordination runs from the former to the latter? Perhaps perception subserves nutrition, or both are coordinate, mutually subservient powers? Walker's response is that while threptic is indeed more fundamental than aesthetic functioning, it is still teleologically less ultimate (63). And this because in and through guiding threptic activity, the aisthētikon has a higher end, namely preserving the animal as a whole (71). Divine approximation thus re-enters the story, but at a higher level (§ 4.5): for by maintaining animals in being, the perceptive power affords them a (more than vegetative, yet far from godlike) measure of immortal activity and goodness.

Chapter five builds on the previous two chapters, and sets up a further puzzle. If the threptikon subserves the aisthētikon, and the latter guides the former, one would assume the same relations obtain between the practical and contemplative intellect or nous (the latter grasping truth more perfectly and precisely than the former). But while phronēsis manifestly approximates and subserves theôria, the latter -- 'an isolated activity that is an end itself' (Andrea Nightingale, cited 81) -- appears not to guide the former. Is this a problem? Yes, Walker adjures, for unlike divine nous, human theoretical intellect depends on lower life-functions, and so would be in vain if it had no guiding role (87). Granted, some scholars maintain that human nous is separable from the body, and hence not subject to natural-scientific canons of explanation. But Walker counters that such separability is merely analytic, not existential in kind (91, 93). And he contends, furthermore, that although theôria is a divine activity, it would be of no benefit to humans if it required us to transcend our embodied (and thus practical) condition in any strong sense.[2] The hunt is on, then, for how, exactly, theôria does guide our biological and practical functioning.

Chapters six to eight delineate in three 'waves' how reason, both practical and (ultimately) contemplative, guides lower life-functions. The first wave recapitulates threptic guidance. Drawing on Plato's tripartite soul, Walker argues that desire (epithumia) and spirit (thumos) could not satisfy our threptic needs healthily or harmoniously without the guidance of reason (logos). The second wave articulates how logos here is a function not merely of practical, but also -- ultimately and most saliently -- of contemplative nous. How so? To begin with, Walker notes that there is an 'understanding requirement' (132) on full ethical virtue: we must grasp not only the bare facts (the hoti) about human nature, but also what explains them (the dioti). Crucially, such explanation requires a theoretical grasp of the universal and unchanging features of that nature (cf. NE 1102a15-26) -- and this is supplied by theôria. But what are these features? Walker appeals at this point to the notion of horoi or 'boundary markers', i.e. the determinants of mean states, which are 'in between excess and deficiency, being according to correct reason' (1138b24-5). And to elaborate these horoi, he has recourse, in turn, to the Protrepticus (§§ 7.5-7).[3] Quoting extensively from Book 10, he makes the case that contemplation's utility lies in its being like a technē or art. For just as good artisans rely on exact measures, so virtuous agents guide their practical reasoning by exact measures of the human good (148). The difference between them is that the virtuous agent must also be a philosopher, for only the philosopher 'lives looking toward nature and toward the divine, and, just like some good steersman fastening the first principles of [his] life to eternal and steadfast things, he goes forth and lives according to himself' (146).[4]

Chapter eight (the third 'wave') details further how contemplation of the divine yields understanding of the human good. Drawing again on the Protrepticus, Walker argues that theôria supplies horoi for the human good by determining not only dispositional excess and deficiency, but also the ontological poles, as it were, between which human agency operates. On the one hand, contemplating the divine 'elucidates how we, as all-too-mortal human beings, are akin to other animal life-forms' (159); on the other, it reveals how our intellect, 'the god in us', establishes our 'relative kinship with the divine' (160; cf. § 8.5). These lower and upper limits to our functioning demonstrate that our good as humans occupies 'an intermediate place between the divine and the bestial' (161). And this delivers a more objective, more comprehensive grasp of our nature than even our friends afford us (§ 8.3).[5] As Walker admits, this grasp is indirect (180-81), because our cosmic intermediacy does not ipso facto provide a positive or fine-grained account of our nature and its good. But as he argues in chapter nine, such explanatory indirection is still fruitful -- indeed, the virtues are systematically illuminated by it. Temperance, for instance, steers a middle course between 'overvaluing the satisfaction of my bodily appetites' (186), as if I were a beast, and paying them insufficient attention, as if I were a god (188). Both (vicious) dispositions will disturb my threptic functioning, and detract, in turn, from my opportunities for contemplation. Courage, for its part, avoids both the hubristic tendency to think myself divinely invulnerable, and the bestial tendency to respond to all occurrent desires as if they were equally exigent (see § 9.3). Viciousness of either type will, again, end up damaging my (peculiarly human) good.

Chapter ten rounds off this impressive volume with (among other things) some reflections on the Platonic Idea of the Good (§ 10.3), and the possibility of contemplation without theology (§ 10.5). What is Walker's overall achievement? In a sense, it is a shame that his interpretation of Aristotle depends on invoking Platonic precedents (especially the Symposium, Republic, Alcibiades, not to mention the early, Platonising Protrepticus). But in each case, he is careful to show that Platonic themes -- such as quasi-immortalisation and the practical relevance of theôria -- have their Aristotelian analogues. Given the paucity of Aristotelian material on theôria, moreover, it seems perfectly reasonable to 'fill in the gaps' using sources that are both continuous with and influential on Aristotle's own thinking.

While I have no quarrel with Walker's method, I do have qualms about its deliverances. On the one hand, his Protrepticus-informed reading of contemplation as (in key part) an ethical technē, which yields 'exact measures' of virtue and vice, still leaves such moral 'boundary markers' at arguably too formal and programmatic a level. Aristotle may claim that 'we perform myriad [actions] in accord with [contemplative knowledge] . . . we choose some things and flee others, and . . . we gain all good things on account of it' (147). But how, exactly? If one thinks, as I do, that a technē-model for practical reasoning is more misleading than helpful,[6] these supposed deliverances of theôria look distinctly unpromising. On the other hand, I would question whether the upper (divine) and lower (bestial) limits of human functioning, which guide Walker's nicely textured tour of the virtues in chapter nine, are fruits of theôria in the first place. For isn't our intermediate position in the scala naturae (182, 187) something we can discover and reflect on without engaging in theôria at all? Such delimiting, ontological horoi not only provide no direct action-guidance, they themselves can be established independently of contemplation.

Even if one accepts these criticisms, however, it does not follow that contemplation is 'useless' vis-à-vis human biological and practical functioning. Besides retaining its supreme eudaimonic value per se and thus enjoining us, in effect, to make ample room for it in our lives, contemplation also yields knowledge of that perfect, eternal mode of functioning toward which all biological and practical functioning aspires. In principle, then, it reveals the good of maintaining bodily health, along with the profound good of both reproduction and lasting intellectual achievement within human life. All of these are modes in which humans become more godlike, and hence flourish. If Walker is right that theôria supplies, in addition, a workable and cogent technē of virtue, then so much the better. But even if it falls short of this, it still holds immense value for humans: not only as a supremely rewarding theoretical activity itself, but also as identifying and guiding us toward manifold practical goods.

[1] See Kenny, A., Aristotle on the Perfect Life (Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1992) and Tkacz, M. W., 'St. Augustine's appropriation and transformation of Aristotelian eudaimonia', in J. Miller (ed.), The Reception of Aristotle's Ethics (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2012, ch. 4). Kenny and Tkacz bear witness to contemporary philosophers' pervasive aversion to any (especially theistic) metaphysical undergirding for ethics.

[2] Such an 'external' (rather than 'immanent') metaphysical reading would 'trichotomize [Aristotle's] biology, ethics, and theology' (97), Walker maintains, and thus have very high interpretative costs.  

[3] A work both authentically Aristotelian and no mere youthful homage to Plato (Walker argues--see 141-2).

[4] This quotation from the Protrepticus is matched by others. E.g. 'for the philosopher alone . . . is imitation from the exact things themselves; for he is a spectator (theatēs) of these, and not of imitations' (146); 'Contemplative indeed, then, is this knowledge, but it allows us to produce, in accord with it, everything' (147).

[5] This view is echoed in the Platonic Alcibiades, from which the NE may well contain borrowings (see § 8.4).

[6] See Tom Angier, Technē in Aristotle's Ethics: Crafting the Moral Life (London: Continuum Publishing, 2010).